Hume's True Scepticism

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Donald C. Ainslie, Hume's True Scepticism, Oxford University Press, 2015, 286pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199593866.

Reviewed by Frederick F. Schmitt, Indiana University


This highly original, beautifully crafted book proposes an interpretation of Hume's treatment of skepticism in Part 4 of Book 1 of A Treatise of Human Nature. There have long been competing interpretations of Hume on skepticism -- skeptical, epistemological naturalist, and dialectical interpretations. Donald C. Ainslie offers an alternative "philosophical" interpretation, according to which the doubts that Hume displays about reason and the belief in body in Part 4 of Book 1 are meant to cast doubt, not on everyday beliefs about causes or bodies (as the skeptical interpretation holds), but on philosophical reflection itself. Philosophical reflection interferes with the operation of our natural propensities, giving rise to doubts that philosophical reflection itself cannot answer. At the same time, this phenomenon of "reflective interference" (p. 219) calls into question the very doubts that arise from the reflection; for the arguments that give rise to these doubts are undermined by questions that are similar enough to the doubts to demand an answer. We are thereby thrown into "temporary confusion" (p. 8). When this confusion dissipates, the resources we possessed before reflection are restored: "we 'return to the situation of the vulgar' (T, SBN 224) by relying on our reasoning, sensing, and introspecting, though now with an understanding of our situation" (p. 243). This return and understanding are enough for Hume's "particular enquiry" in Books 2 and 3 of the Treatise. We also have a new appreciation of the value and limits of philosophy. The result is a "true skepticism" -- in which the philosopher is, in Hume's phrase, "diffident of his philosophical doubts, as well as of his conviction" (T Hume's hope in promoting true skepticism is to domesticate philosophy:

First . . . philosophy turns out to be unable to offer a justification or repudiation of our fundamental tendencies to believe. We must learn to live with a kind of 'blind' embrace of our natural epistemic propensities. Second, there is no special obligation to philosophize . . . Rather, because philosophy's lessons can be useful in helping us understand how best to investigate the world, those who have an inclination for it should pursue it, while keeping its limitations in mind. (p. 2)

According to Ainslie, "part of Hume's goal in his explorations of skepticism in Sections 1 and 2 of Part 4 is to show that only his model of the mind can make sense of our experience in reaction to sceptical challenges" (pp. 7-8). Much of Ainslie's book spells out Hume's support for his theory of mind by appeal to observations of the natural resilience of our beliefs in the face of skepticism. This resilience is explained by reflective interference. What is attributed to Hume here is so far empirical psychology. However, reflective interference figures importantly in Hume's response to skepticism. And for Ainslie this includes normative theory, as we can see from his insistence that his philosophical interpretation solves the "integration problem" left unsolved by the skeptical interpretation (pp. 221, 227-30). On the latter interpretation, Hume concludes that we have no justified beliefs; yet he proceeds to his "particular enquiry" of Books 2 and 3 as if its results are justified. The skeptical interpretation leaves this inconsistency unresolved. Ainslie proposes a resolution: for Hume the "desponding reflections" of T 1.4.7 do not support skepticism but rather the rejection of the philosophical reflection that gives rise to the skeptical conclusion. When we emerge from philosophical reflection we abandon its posture of treating the mind as "standing over and superintending" its mental processes (p. 219). This reading solves the integration problem because our abandonment of philosophical reflection allows us to proceed to justify the particular results of Hume's empirical psychological inquiry in Books 2 and 3: "We cannot offer a fundamental justification of causal reasoning or our introspective observations, but this does not stop us from justifying particular causal claims about perceptions, using the same norms for causal belief that apply to common life (namely, the 'logic' of T 1.3.15)" (p. 243).

In chapter 1, Ainslie argues with plausibility that in the first section of Part 4, T 1.4.1, Hume supports his own account of belief as "the outcome of experience-engendered association" (p. 40) by offering an objection to the rival account of belief as an act of assent. Hume's objection is that if belief were an act of assent, reflection would drive us to a permanent suspension of judgment in light of our fallibility, contrary to our observation that we persist in belief despite recognizing our fallibility. Reflection does indeed reveal "legitimate philosophical questions" (p. 40) about reason that should reduce our belief: "it is a peculiarly philosophical state of mind that drives us into the regress" (p. 34). But the philosophical doubts that arise when we ask such questions do not actually reduce our belief. This fact demands explanation. Hume offers the explanation that experience-engendered associations prevent us from repeatedly considering the doubts; we do not "stand over" our beliefs in the manner entailed by the account of belief as an act of assent. Ainslie treats this as parallel to Hume's explanation in T 1.4.2 of our persistence in the belief in body despite philosophical doubts: the doubts arise from philosophers "prescinding" (Ainslie's term) from our experience-engendered associations, and our beliefs persist in the face of this doubt in virtue of the reassertion of these experience-engendered associations. The fact that philosophical doubts generate the regress, and experience-engendered associations inhibit it, is supposed to support the overarching philosophical interpretation that Hume blames our skeptical conclusions on philosophical reflection itself and proposes that recovery from encounters with skepticism turns on the role of experience-engendered associations.

It is important for the support of Ainslie's philosophical interpretation that the reduction in T 1.4.1 turns on doubts arising from "a peculiarly philosophical state of mind." Ainslie does not explicitly define "philosophical state of mind." But for guidance as to what he means, we may look to his view that the doubts about body of T 1.4.2 are philosophical in arising in reflection that "prescinds" from the everyday associative responses that give us "a sense of immersion in a world of persisting, public objects" (p. 42) and thereby throws us into doubt that does not occur in everyday life. Is he right that for Hume the reduction of reason arises from a philosophical state of mind in the sense of reflection that somehow abstracts from our everyday associative responses in using reason, that asks whether our belief-forming operations are meritorious, and that throws us into doubt that does not occur in everyday life?

I do not think so. According to Ainslie, Hume's explanation for why we do not persist in the reduction is that the associations that would otherwise produce a reduction to suspension of judgment have less and less effect as the reduction is iterated.[1] This attribution is plausible, yet at odds with Ainslie's purpose of supporting the philosophical interpretation. We can see this by noting that it introduces a disanalogy between T 1.4.1 and T 1.4.2. For the reduced effect of these associations does not result from introspection and philosophical reasoning, as in the case of T 1.4.2 (where the prescission of associative responses stems from philosophical investigation showing that perceptions are our only objects). Indeed, the reduced effect of the associations does not even result from reflection but merely from the cessation of more or less automatic probable inferences that would otherwise reduce the target belief.[2] This disanalogy with T 1.4.2 calls into question whether we may take T 1.4.1 to attribute the failure of reduction to a philosophical state of mind, as is required to support the philosophical interpretation.

In chapters 2, 3, and 4, Ainslie offers an account -- the most probing in the Hume literature -- of Hume's T 1.4.2 investigation of the belief in continued and distinct body. According to Hume, the vulgar take themselves to be in contact with body as they understand it, but what they take themselves to be in contact with is in fact an impression. Philosophers argue (by the double-image and perceptual relativity arguments, T that the vulgar belief in distinct body is false because what the vulgar believe to exist does not in fact exist, since perceptions depend on the mind. These arguments lead philosophers to the philosophical belief in continued and distinct body, on which body is not a perception. On Ainslie's interpretation, the very doubts that philosophers raise for the vulgar belief in body (by the double-image and perceptual relativity arguments) prevent them from answering Hume's doubt about the philosophical belief in body (i.e., that the belief is unsupported by causal inference, and the operation that produces it arises indirectly from the unjustifying operation that produces the vulgar belief in body). Hume's verdict about the belief in body, expressed in the last two paragraphs of T 1.4.2, is that neither the vulgar nor the philosophical belief in body is justified according to philosophical reflection. This verdict then destabilizes or reduces confidence in the belief in body. Yet after we leave philosophical reflection, the belief reasserts itself.

Ainslie may be right that in the inquiry of T 1.4.2 into the justification of the belief in body, Hume takes philosophers to prescind from everyday associative responses. But the philosophical interpretation requires that Hume takes himself to prescind in this way in the course of the philosophical reflection that leads him to a skeptical conclusion about body and then to confusion. The reason for saying that he does must be that it is obvious to reflection that it would make sense for him to entertain a doubt as to whether the impression results from an external object only if while reflecting he suppresses the thought that a given impression is of an external object.

But this reason presupposes that for Hume the business of philosophical reflection is the same as it is for the philosophers he studies, who argue their way to the existence of distinct body: it is to try to justify our belief in body given his impressions, thus arguing his way from impressions to the conclusion that external objects exist. I doubt that this is how Hume conceives of his business in philosophical reflection in T 1.4.2. I think he conceives of it as a different business -- not to try to justify the belief in body in this way, but to ask whether, given the way people do or could form their beliefs about bodies, these beliefs are justified. In this business, there is no question of whether the inquirer's (i.e., Hume's) prescission from associations is necessary for doubt; for the inquirer is not trying to infer from impressions to beliefs and does not need the sort of reason, doubt, that the subject needs to make such an inference. Certainly the inquirer may end up doubting, but this would not be an initial doubt that needs to be answered before the belief in body can be justifiedly reached; rather it is a doubt that arises from failing to reach certainty as to whether we are justified in the belief in body. The activity of prescission could still be relevant here, not as a condition of whether the inquirer is in a position to justify the belief in body, but rather as a possible condition of the subject that prevents the subject's having a justified belief. It is, however, far from clear that a subject's prescission from associations is such an obstacle to the justifying power of the subject's inference to the existence of body. This is unclear even if a subject who prescinds has no way to reason to the existence of body. Hume, in my view, addresses the question whether an inference is justifying by checking whether it is reliable. But the subject's prescission from associations does not obviously provide the inquirer with a reason to doubt the reliability of an inference. Nor does Hume's actual worry about, e.g., the inference from coherence depend on any notice of the subject's prescission; it depends rather on the fact that the inference from coherence is an instance of the generally unreliable propensity to complete a uniformity. (Analogous points about the role of prescission would hold on interpretations of Hume's theory of justification other than the reliability interpretation.)

Ainslie makes a riveting proposal: that for Hume the philosophers' arguments for the falsity of the vulgar belief in distinct body (i.e., the double-image and perceptual relativity arguments) are vulnerable to "reflective interference," a source of the confusion produced by our reflections. For the premises of these arguments (e.g., that when we press our eye, we have a double impression) are justified (if at all) by introspection of perceptions. But on the philosophers' own theory of such introspection, that operation brings us into direct contact with perceptions. Yet the conclusion of the argument denies the vulgar view that we are in direct contact with bodies. This conclusion then calls into question the philosophers' theory of introspection, thereby undermining the justifiedness of the premises of the arguments. As Ainslie puts it:

philosophers' introspectively derived conclusions about sensing depend on their believing the verdicts of their reflections: they remain vulgar with respect to the mind. So if they are tempted to reject the vulgar beliefs about objects because of their dependence on the 'trivial qualities of the fancy' (T, SBN 217), these philosophers should similarly reject the reflective conclusions that led to the initial rejection; they too depend on 'trivial qualities of the fancy' (p. 147)

To respond, I do not find it clear that for Hume the philosophers' arguments for the falsity of the vulgar belief in distinct body are undermined by such "reflective interference." Whether these arguments justify their conclusion even for the philosophers should (on Hume's account of justification) depend only on whether introspection in fact justifies the premises of the arguments. Of course introspection justifies the premises for the philosophers only if this justification is not undermined for the philosophers by the conclusion of the argument. But it is not clear why the fact that the philosophers hold a particular (and for Hume mistaken) theory of introspection should facilitate such undermining. Whether the justification is undermined would seem to depend only on the real nature of introspection.

A more fundamental worry is that what matters for whether Hume takes the overall argument of T 1.4.2 to yield an unequivocal skepticism about body (rather than confusion, as Ainslie proposes) is not whether the arguments for the falsity of the vulgar belief justify their conclusion for the philosophers, but whether they justify their conclusion for the inquirer following reason under reflection (i.e., Hume as narrator, if not author, of T 1.4.2). And this turns only on whether the arguments justify their conclusion for that inquirer, hence on whether the premises of the arguments are not undermined for that inquirer. Even if the premises were undermined for the philosophers because of their theory of introspection, it would not follow that they are undermined for the inquirer unless the inquirer shares that theory of introspection. The question of whether the inquirer shares that theory of introspection is the same as the question of whether that theory recommends itself to reason under reflection. I would think that Ainslie is committed to saying that it doesn't recommend itself, since he holds that Hume's considered theory of introspection (presumably accepted by reason under reflection) is at odds with the philosophers'. In any event, the inquirer of T 1.4.2 isn't obviously committed to any particular theory of introspection, or at least any theory contrary to Hume's own.

A final, dialectical problem with the appeal to reflective interference is that if Hume thought that the conclusion of the arguments for the falsity of the vulgar belief in distinct body undermined the justification of the premises of the arguments, his basis for thinking so (i.e., the point of parity between the vulgar view of contact with body and the philosophers' view of contact with perceptions) would be available to ordinary reason within the context of the larger T 1.4.2 argument for skepticism about body. Reason would then reject the arguments as not justifying their conclusion, thereby preventing the arguments from serving the supporting purpose that Hume assigns them in the larger argument for skepticism about body. From this I conclude that Hume is committed to denying that the arguments for the falsity of the vulgar belief in distinct body are undermined by reflective interference.[3]

In chapter 5, Ainslie addresses Hume's criticisms of doctrines of substance, both material substance in T 1.4.3 and immaterial substance in T 1.4.5. This chapter contains the best discussions in the literature of Hume's separability and conceivability principles and of true and false philosophy. In chapter 6, Ainslie treats Hume on personal identity, the bundle theory of mind, the nature of consciousness in T 1.4.6, and, in connection with that, Hume on the modern philosophy of external objects. Chapter 8 provides a new solution to the puzzle over Hume's "second thoughts" about personal identity. These chapters contain a wealth of novel insights into Hume on the mind, carefully tied to the interpretation of skepticism.

I turn finally to Ainslie's chapter 7, the linchpin of the book, which interprets Hume's skepticism in T 1.4.7 in a manner supported by Ainslie's parallel interpretations of T 1.4.1 and T 1.4.2. Ainslie proposes that the point of Hume's "desponding reflections" is to raise philosophical doubts about our belief-forming operations and expose our inability to answer these doubts within the resources allowed by philosophy: "Reflection interferes with our mental processes, undermining both our tendencies to believe and our capacities to reflect. But . . . this was a problem only for philosophy, and leaves us, in common life, continuing to believe our reasonings and sensings without trouble" (p. 219). This failure of philosophy chastens it, leaving an enterprise that is optional but agreeable for people with curiosity. Enough remains of the philosophy Hume has done in Book 1 to proceed to the study of the passions and morality in Books 2 and 3. There is a superb discussion contrasting this philosophical interpretation with its skeptical, naturalistic, and dialectical rivals.

I am unsure whether the philosophical interpretation avoids the "integration problem" justly pressed against the skeptical interpretation by Ainslie. The remedy for skepticism the philosophical interpretation attributes to Hume is to leave behind the philosophical reflection that leads to skeptical conclusions and the confusion of T At the same time, after leaving such philosophical reflection behind, we are supposed to proceed with Hume's "particular enquiry" of Books 2 and 3, which depends on much of his psychology in Book 1, and in which we justify particular beliefs. This raises a question. On what basis may Hume claim that we do justify particular beliefs before and after we embark on reflection? Presumably the associative responses that give us our sense of immersion in the world are enough for us to justify particular beliefs. But what is the basis for saying so? The worry is that to answer the question, Hume must begin on a reflective investigation of whether we justify particular beliefs. But this investigation, although about justifying particular beliefs, must be systematic, and likely involves the very considerations as to whether operations can justify that earlier led, through prescission, to skepticism and confusion. Perhaps investigating this or that fact about the world would not by itself require such a systematic investigation. But to avoid the integration problem, Hume must provide a satisfying answer, not merely to questions of fact, but to questions as to whether we do justify our beliefs pre- and post-reflection. How is Hume to prevent the latter investigation from getting out of hand?

I have not had space to mention dozens of other searching discussions in this rich, imaginative, meticulous, scholarly book. Though I have raised a few doubts about Ainslie's proposals, I want to leave no doubt that this is one of the very most thought-provoking books yet written on Hume. It challenges many conventional assumptions about Hume, and gives him a new look. It is a look so different from what one is used to that I fear I may have fallen prey to some illusions both in reading Ainslie and in responding to him. I expect many rewarding re-readings and trust that these will correct my errors. Ainslie's is an indispensable contribution to the literature on Hume and on the history of the philosophy of mind and epistemology.


I would like to thank Marcia Baron for helpful comments on this review.

[1] Ainslie proposes a more exact etiology: "as we are forced further and further back in the regress, we no longer have had the relevant experiences needed to get our associations off the ground" (p. 38). I do not see how this more exact etiology can be part of Hume's explanation. For if we had fewer relevant experiences to support the associations as we proceeded in the regress, we would cease to have sufficient observations to support a probable inference to a belief in our fallibility, and reason "when it acts alone, and according to its own most general principles" (T would cease to reduce the target belief for want of a sufficient observational basis. And this is contrary to Hume's claim that reason acting alone reduces belief to suspension of judgment, which requires that reason rests on sufficient observations to reduce belief repeatedly when it is uninhibited by the sensitive character of belief. But I don't think this difficulty with Ainslie's more exact etiology detracts from his less exact explanation of the reduction described in the sentence footnoted.

[2] Here are some other differences that stand in the way of Ainslie's analogy. First, it seems inapt to describe the reduced effect of the associations as the result of "abstracting" from associations (which I take to be the closest available analogue of prescission); rather, it results from some inability to retain or convey the force of the associations (on Ainslie's more exact etiology, from a paucity of relevant observations). Second, the associations that lose effect support assessments of fallibility, not of the target belief; this contrasts with the case of body, where the associative responses from which philosophers prescind support the target belief in body. Thus,according to Ainslie,  the reduced effect cited in T 1.4.1 works against a role for associations in maintaining and supporting our beliefs, contrasting with the supporting role of associative responses in T 1.4.2. Third, the persistence of belief does not depend on the restoration of associations, as it does in the case of T 1.4.2.

[3] Granted, in the case of reason acting alone, Hume (T castigates, as ineffective against the reduction, the objection that the reductive reasoning that leads to suspension of judgment is fallacious on the ground that it reduces not only the target judgment but the dictates of reason that give rise to the reduction, hence it undermines its own basis. Hume's reply to this is that once the dictates that give rise to the reduction have been suspended, we return to our initial state at the beginning of the reductive reasoning, and the reduction starts all over again -- a point that Hume takes to be good enough for a skeptical outcome. But this case is disanalogous to the case of body in at least this respect. In the case of reason, the question is whether the reductive reasoning to the suspension of judgment nonfallaciously reaches the suspension, and this makes it possible for Hume to respond to the charge of undermining by saying that it doesn't matter whether the reasoning is undermined, since if it is, the reasoning begins anew, and the outcome is still skeptical. But in the case of body, the argument leads to a conclusion (the falsity of the vulgar belief in distinct body) that serves as a premise in further reasoning that, for Hume, leads to skepticism. This argument cannot be undermined as it reaches its conclusion (as the reductive reasoning is), or else that further reasoning could not lead to skepticism.