Husserl at the Limits of Phenomenology

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Merleau-Ponty, Maurice, Husserl at the Limits of Phenomenology, Including Texts by Edmund Husserl, edited by Leonard Lawlor with Bettina Bergo, Northwestern University Press, 2002, 192pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0810117479.

Reviewed by Eric Matthews , University of Aberdeen


This useful addition to Northwestern’s series Studies in Phenomenology and Existential Philosophy contains a number of related works by different authors. At its heart, and giving unity to the whole volume, are Merleau-Ponty’s “Course Notes” for the course which he gave at the Collège de France in 1959-60 under the title “Husserl aux limites de la phénoménologie”, together with a revised version of John O’Neill’s translation of the summary of this course, which originally appeared in In Praise of Philosophy and Other Essays, published by Northwestern UP in 1988. The other works in the present volume provide either background to, or commentary on, the Course Notes. In particular, Part 2 consists of three essays by Husserl which Merleau-Ponty commented on in his course: “The Origin of Geometry”, “Foundational Investigations of the Phenomenological Origin of the Spatiality of Nature” and “The World of the Living Present and the Constitution of the Surrounding World That is Outside the Flesh”. In his Foreword, the principal editor, Leonard Lawlor, sets Merleau-Ponty’s thinking in the Course Notes in retrospective and prospective context: retrospectively in relation to Husserl and Heidegger, and prospectively as anticipating Derrida. In her Afterword, the other editor, Bettina Bergo, explores Merleau-Ponty’s deviations from Husserlian phenomenology. Finally, there is a helpful glossary of German terms, and a note on the history of the texts included in the volume.

It is obvious, even from this brief summary of the contents, that the volume could be of interest from different perspectives: to students of Husserl, in showing how another great philosopher interpreted some of Husserl’s works, and to students of the history of French philosophy in the twentieth century, for the light it sheds on a key transitional period in that development. But its primary interest will be for scholars of Merleau-Ponty’s thought – not in its relation to that of other philosophers, but simply for its own sake. Here we see Merleau-Ponty towards the end of his tragically short life, still grappling with Husserlian phenomenology, as he had been throughout his career, and extracting new insights from it to develop his own philosophy.

At the most obvious level, what Merleau-Ponty was offering in his lectures was a commentary on Husserl: but we need to ask what he understood by a “commentary” on another philosopher. As Leonard Lawlor points out in his Foreword, Merleau-Ponty rejected the idea of an “objective”, in the sense of a disinterested, reading of a philosopher in which we simply try to “appropriate” from the outside that philosopher’s thoughts. This, according to Merleau-Ponty, obscures what the philosopher has to say: a thought, as he says (p.14), is “the circumscription of an unthought”. The philosopher himself is not, as he goes on to say, “the absolute possessor of all of his thoughts”, and we can understand what his thoughts were only through the world on to which they open. Using a term borrowed from Husserl himself, Merleau-Ponty speaks of “poetizing” the history of philosophy – in other words, as the editor points out, creatively interpreting it. Merleau-Ponty’s point seems to be that the thoughts of a philosopher emerge only from a dialogue between the philosopher and his commentator, in which, of course, the interests of the commentator play a part. In this way, Merleau-Ponty’s commentary on Husserl (or anyone else) is as much a development of his (Merleau-Ponty’s) thoughts as an exposition of Husserl.

This implies in turn, of course, that our own understanding of Merleau-Ponty’s text will be more than a disinterested appropriation of the words on the page. It too will be the outcome of a dialogue between ourselves as readers and the author. Moreover, there is another, more mundane, problem. What we have on these pages are lecture notes, rather than the continuous prose of a written treatise. Anyone who has ever given a lecture which is more than a verbatim reading aloud of a written text will know what that means. Lecture notes are simply brief reminders of what the lecturer intends to say, and so are liable to be cryptic to anyone other than their author. This is clearly so in this case. Some passages are reasonably transparent, but others need a good deal of hermeneutic reflection to make any kind of sense at all (and it is correspondingly uncertain what their sense might be). We can gain some help from knowledge of Merleau-Ponty’s other works, especially those of the same period, including, of course, the summary of the course which is contained in this volume. But it would be presumptuous to be anything more than tentative in our interpretation of Merleau-Ponty’s late philosophy, as contained in these notes.

Husserl’s essay on “The Origin of Geometry” was originally published (minus the first two paragraphs) in 1939 in Revue internationale de philosophie, 1, no 2. The editors of the present volume suggest that hints in the first two paragraphs indicate that it was meant for inclusion in Husserl’s The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology. Certainly, these paragraphs connect the problem of the essay with Galileo, one of whose major contributions to the development of the modern scientific world-view was his thesis that the book of Nature is written in the language of geometry, and can be read only by those who know that language. It is the objectivist conception of our relation to nature implicit in this thesis which is, of course, a central source of the “crisis” of which the title of Husserl’s work speaks. Merleau-Ponty clearly makes the connection with the themes of the Crisis volume. His commentary on Husserl’s essay treats it throughout as an attempt to give an account, not only of geometry but of all forms of ideality, which avoids false objectification of ideal entities by relating them always to their base in human experience. He speaks in the Resumé of the Course (p. 9) of the need, through meditation, to ’learn of a mode of being the idea of which we have lost, the being of the “ground” (Boden), and that of the Earth first of all – the earth where we live …’. Later on the same page, he contrasts this with the ’Copernican constitution of the world’ which means that ’I pretend to be an absolute observer, forgetting my terrestrial roots which nevertheless nourish everything else’ and ’consider the world as the pure object of an infinite thought’.

This is reminiscent of the programmatic statements at the beginning of Phenomenology of Perception, and here, as in that work, Merleau-Ponty connects starting from terrestrial roots with starting from the embodiment of our subjectivity and from the access which that embodiment gives us to the subjectivity of others. Nevertheless, it is true that these Course Notes, like his other late works, are no longer works of “phenomenology” in the classical Husserlian sense. They are the expression of an “ontologized phenomenology”, owing more to Heidegger than Husserl. Or rather, as Merleau-Ponty himself says, (p.53-4), they follow what the later Husserl was himself attempting (perhaps without fully realising it) to do, namely, to take phenomenology up to its limits in order to transform it into ontology: we do not really understand Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty argues, unless we follow what Husserl was trying to do here.

What was objectionable about the original version of phenomenology, for Merleau-Ponty, was the tendency towards rationalism inherent in its conception of transcendental subjectivity as ’existing in the singular, beyond the plurality of humans and the world’. Ironically, to treat the phenomenological subject in this way was precisely to engage in the objectification of ideal abstractions, and of the world as constituted by them, which gave rise to the crisis which Husserl identified in his last writings. This in its turn led to an implicit idealism, according to which the world of our actual experience was distinct from the world as it is in itself. The project of ontologizing phenomenology, at least as Merleau-Ponty seems to have seen it, was that of abandoning both this idealism and its fellow-traveller objectivism and re-affirming the links between our consciousness and the world of which we are conscious. (In many ways, this was Merleau-Ponty’s project in his earlier works too, but he seems to have come to think in his later life that perhaps he had not freed himself sufficiently from “transcendental phenomenology” in his best-known works).

At the heart of this project was the need to give a non-objectivist account of ideal entities. Geometry must be seen from this point of view as existing ’only in a space of humanity’, that is, as resting on human acts, which made it, and other forms of ideality, historical. Merleau-Ponty’s reading of Husserl’s essay suggested to him that speech-acts played a key role, that we should see man, world and language as “interwoven”. As in other works, he distinguishes between “spoken speech”, the ready-made language constituted by past acts of speaking, and “speaking speech”, language in the course of being constituted. Because we speak to others, the thoughts expressed in language are not the contents of my individual mind, but a “coproduction” of myself and others. They take on a life of their own, existing in between subjects, but clearly not independent of human subjects – they are, after all, a human creation. There are no “subjects” and “objects”, and so no subject-object relation. It is inter subjectivity which constitutes the horizon of humanity. We are human, Merleau-Ponty says, neither when at the pole of brute individual existence nor when at the opposite pole of pure ideality. The horizon of humanity is “between me and other individuals. It is not object” (p. 35). This is what Merleau-Ponty calls his “antihumanistic humanism”, a good description of his position, implying as it does that the position is both humanistic, in the sense of rooting ideality in human existence, and yet antihumanist, in the sense of rejecting traditional humanist emphasis on individual subjectivity.

In a sense, as said above, this apparently contradictory phrase could apply to the whole of Merleau-Ponty’s work throughout his career. One of the things which is most fascinating about the present volume is that it shows him still wrestling with these problems at the end of his life, dissatisfied with earlier attempts, even while still using some of the concepts he had earlier employed. For those who, like this reviewer, are devoted to the thought of Merleau-Ponty, it will be an invaluable source for the study of the ways in which that thought was developing towards the end of his life. The editorial materials included are on the whole helpful, though Leonard Lawlor’s Foreword dwells rather too much on the relation between late Merleau-Ponty and early Derrida – two thinkers who, it seems to me, had very different preoccupations, whatever similarities there may have been between them in some respects. The result is that, in some parts of the Foreword, Merleau-Ponty’s thoughts are described in an inappropriate and confusingly obscure Derridean language, which reduces the value of the commentary. In general, however, this is a book strongly to be recommended to all those working in this area.