Husserl: German Perspectives

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John J. Drummond and Otfried Höffe (eds.), Husserl: German Perspectives, Fordham University Press, 2019, 361pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823284467.

Reviewed by Thomas Nenon, University of Memphis


This volume presents translations of twelve important essays on Husserl written by leading Husserl scholars that include a number of classic essays by some of Husserl's own students (e.g., Ludwig Landgrebe and Jan Patočka). It also contains some relatively recent essays by many of the most prominent Husserl scholars at the end of the twentieth and beginning of the twenty-first centuries. Clearly, one purpose of the volume is to make these essays accessible to readers who are interested in Husserl, but whose German is not sufficient to work through the original essays. However, even for scholars comfortable in German, the volume is a worthwhile addition simply because of the range and outstanding quality of the essays.

All of the scholars are well-versed in Husserl and sympathetic to his phenomenological project, albeit for the most part with qualifications or modifications. As a result, their essays are weighted toward explications of well-known texts or positions presented in a way that helps defend Husserl's work against some of the more simplistic criticisms levelled against it. The defenses are themselves phenomenological, pointing back to the kinds of experiences Husserl is trying to describe and recasting them in terms less likely to be taken in a Cartesian vein, which several of the essays explicitly see as the source of common misunderstandings and criticism. These include, particularly, terms like "subjectivity" and "consciousness" that they recast in terms of like "experience."

This is related to another common theme throughout the collection: that the difference between Husserl and Heidegger is not as great as it is often taken to be, and that one way to understand Heidegger's project is to see it as a continuation of Husserlian phenomenology with a mindful and explicit attempt to purge it of Cartesian vestiges that mask the radicality and new possibilities opened up by Husserl's approach. The commonality of these themes across the essays is not an accident. In their brief introduction, the editors describe how they understand phenomenology as "a descriptive science of the essential structures of experiences and their objects just as experienced" (2). They identify significant differences between the first and second editions of the Logical Investigations as attempts to overcome the traces of Cartesian understandings of subjectivity and consciousness that led the first edition to remain trapped in a kind of psychologism that the "Prolegomena" to the Logical Investigations had famously refuted. They argue that Husserl's thoroughgoing self-critique in the decade following the Investigations led him to his mature project of transcendental phenomenology, and that the full implications of this self-critique were recognized and critically, but constructively, carried out by his phenomenological successors, above all Heidegger. The essays selected for this volume confirm this working hypothesis in different ways.

The book is divided into three parts. The first part deals with "Phenomenology and Its Methodology" with four essays by Sonja Rinofner-Kreidl, Landgrebe, Patočka, and Dieter Lohmar. The second part brings together five essays on topics broadly related to "Aspects of Intentionality" by Karl Schuhmann, Verena Mayer und Christopher Erhard, Ullrich Melle, Klaus Held, and Rudolf Bernet. I say "broadly" because the specific topics have to do with forms of intentionality, namely temporality in Held's case and notions of truth and untruth in Husserl and Heidegger in Bernet's; but they go well beyond intentionality as a general formal structure. Finally, the volume closes with three essays under the heading of "Subjectivity and Culture" by Karl Mertens, Elisabeth Ströker, and Ernst Wolfgang Orth. Overall, each contributes in one way or another to the overarching themes described above.

For instance, Rinofner-Kreidl lays out very clearly how Husserl was still in the process of wrestling with the problem of psychologism in the Logical Investigations in his initial description of phenomenology as "the name for pure description of cognitive states of affairs" (30). She describes how it evolved over the following decade into a "universal critique of theoretical, practical, and evaluative reason: philosophy of pure subjectivity" (36). It does not shift away from an analysis of consciousness but now comes to combat the tendency to naturalize consciousness. Landgrebe takes this approach a step further, and distinguishes a two-fold thrust in Husserl's phenomenological development. On the one hand, there is an "eidetic-psychological" strain that seeks to uncover the fundamental structures of experiencing, and an "ontological" one that seeks to the objectivity and ideality of meaning and the genuine objectivity of the non-ideal objects of experience as well. Landgrebe's claim is that Heidegger best understood this, a claim that the other most famous Czech phenomenologist, Patočka, not only endorses, but tries to develop in his essay that views Heidggerian phenomenology as the culmination of Husserl's project. Lohmar's essay, in contrast, is much more immanent to Husserl as he elucidates the multi-faceted, often misunderstood, and crucial operation of eidetic variation that is the actual technique Husserl employs in the different kinds of projects described in Part I's other three essays. Lohmar shows how it falls short of Husserl's initial hopes for a method that would provide a definitive and final solution to all the problems phenomenology addresses, in particular for concepts that contain cultural senses. That does not mean that it is not a useful tool, only that this limitation validates some criticisms of overly ambitious formulations of the possibilities of phenomenology as an a priori science.

Since Husserl identified intentionality as one of the most basic structures of consciousness and as the link between the analysis of experiencing and the objects that are experienced, another way of describing the project of analyzing experience or consciousness is an analysis of intentionality and the intentional objects that present themselves to us in consciousness. Part II begins with Schuhmann's essay in which he maintains that the true source of Husserl's specific conception of intentionality is not Brentano, but Twardowski, who had recognized the fundamental incongruities in Brentano's approach and developed a notion of intentionality that took it in a direction that Husserl not only knew, but explicitly confronted in an essay prior to the Logical Investigations. He argues that Husserl, not Twardowski, successfully developed a notion of intentionality that avoids Brentano's problems and is the basis for his own phenomenological analyses. The chapter by Mayer and Erhard, and the one by Melle, both address the question of what Husserl means by "objectifying acts" in the Logical Investigations and afterwards. Mayer and Erhard explore the notion in the Investigations and locate the question within the discussion of merely presenting vs. positing acts and nominal vs. assertive acts. They describe his discussions of the topic as "convoluted paths" and correctly note the basic point that objectifying acts point to the teleological structure of consciousness and acts of possible fulfillment of objectifying intentions.

Melle rightly shows how Husserl in the following years came to take this intention/fulfillment structure as fundamental to reason itself. He applied it not just to theoretical assertions but to acts of willing and valuing as well in that the latter point to possible fulfillment or disappointments of that which is posited to be valuable or good in acts of valuing or choosing. Finally, Held contends that Husserl's analyses of intentionality can ultimately be placed within an increasing insight into the broader structure of temporality. Here he departs from what he sees as the Cartesian language in which Husserl's own analyses of temporality and the notion of the "living present" are couched and develops clearly and succinctly how what he takes to be the insights guiding Husserl are what motivate Heidegger's earlier work as well, once they are freed from the Cartesian assumptions that Husserl struggled to escape. Bernet focuses on the difference in the way that Heidegger's notion of truth, and thereby also untruth, builds on the Husserlian intention/fulfillment structure but goes beyond it to notions of ontological untruth that tap into dimensions that escape Husserl.

The three final essays are much broader in their focus. In "Husserl's Phenomenology of the Monad: Remarks on Husserl's Confrontation with Leibniz," Mertens contrast Husserl's "monadological" approach to intersubjectivity in "Fifth Meditation" and elsewhere with the approach he takes in the Ideas II that examines the way others are given to me in horizon of concrete social life and argues that the former is ultimately a dead end that Husserl rightly avoided in other places. Ströker places Husserl in a larger cultural context that opens an awareness of the world as socially and historically constituted in scientific and other ways that can show themselves to us in their validity and limitations from the standpoint of phenomenology as a form of critical self-reflection and self-responsibility. Orth takes this approach further, arguing that, in spite of Husserl's own intentions and protestations to the contrary, his work has implications for a philosophical anthropology from the outset and that his later reflections on the life-world reveal human being as not just conscious and embodied, but also as a concrete cultural and historically situated phenomenon as well.

The essays present Husserlian phenomenology as an evolving project open to refinement by Husserl himself as his thought developed and by later phenomenologists. For scholars interested in Husserl, the collection brings together key essays that should be essential reading for them. However, these strong readings also make the case that Husserlian phenomenology properly understood and many of Husserl's insights remain relevant for current philosophical research in general.