Husserl, Heidegger, and the Space of Meaning: Paths toward Transcendental Phenomenology

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Steven Galt Crowell, Husserl, Heidegger, and the Space of Meaning: Paths toward Transcendental Phenomenology, Northwestern University Press, 2001, 323 pp, $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-810-11805-X.

Reviewed by Taylor Carman, Barnard College, Columbia University


The ongoing publication and translation of Martin Heidegger’s Gesamtausgabe, in particular his Freiburg and Marburg lectures dating from the late 1910s and early 1920s, have in recent years spawned a veritable cottage industry of discussion and debate about a figure some now refer to as the “young” Heidegger, as opposed to the “early” Heidegger of Being and Time, who is in turn customarily distinguished from the “later” Heidegger of the 1930s and beyond. Heidegger’s very early lectures understandably bear the stamp of his teachers, the neo-Kantian Heinrich Rickert as well as the phenomenologist Edmund Husserl; historical influences as diverse as Kant, Aristotle, Aquinas, and St. Paul; and other contemporary neo-Kantians such as Paul Natorp and the now nearly forgotten Emil Lask. Since those early lectures paint a fascinating portrait of a philosopher maturing and innovating at a truly remarkable rate prior to the publication of his magnum opus in 1927, the question naturally arises, Do the apparent discrepancies between the young Heidegger and the early Heidegger call for a radical reassessment of the project of fundamental ontology undertaken in Being and Time, or do they tend to confirm one of the several already familiar competing interpretations of that notoriously deep and difficult text?

In this collection of essays, all but one of them previously published, Steven Crowell offers a subtle and original defense of a generally familiar, though by no means uncontroversial, picture of Heidegger’s philosophy and its early development. He rejects, quite rightly, the revisionism urged by some advocates of the young Heidegger, notably John van Buren, who finds in Heidegger’s pre-Being and Time lectures a “negative, deconstructive, skeptical thinking,” which puts him “close to Derrida.”1 By contrast, where others hear (or imagine hearing) in Heidegger’s early lectures echoes of either the mysticism of the later Heidegger or the skepticism of later deconstructionists, Crowell admits candidly that “the real hero of my Heidegger story is neither Heidegger nor Derrida, but Husserl” (7).

Indeed, the central argument running throughout the volume is a denial that there is any radical break between Heidegger’s hermeneutic approach to fundamental ontology, which offers an interpretation of human existence as “being-in-the-world,” and Husserl’s transcendental phenomenology, which purports to “bracket” the world external to consciousness and focus intuitive reflection on the essential structures of subjectivity. The two projects are not identical, according to Crowell, but they are largely continuous, for “Being and Time’s ‘existentialism’ is in fact a consequence of thinking the ‘scientific’ character of phenomenological philosophy, begun in the early lectures, through to the end” (151). It was, as Crowell sees it, not by repudiating, but by adopting and transforming Husserl’s enterprise that Heidegger made his own distinctive contribution: “the ‘parting of the ways’ between the two phenomenologists makes better sense as an immanent criticism of Husserl’s transcendental program rather than as its wholesale rejection” (181). Crowell’s treatments of the relevant texts, not just Husserl’s and Heidegger’s, but also those of Lask and Eugen Fink, are consistently thorough and clear. And yet, it seems to me, he draws the wrong conclusions from them concerning the philosophical point and importance of Being and Time, or so I shall argue.

Crowell’s discussion is informed and illuminating, placing Heidegger as it does in the context of the prevailing neo-Scholastic, neo-Kantian, and phenomenological currents of the day. The early chapters on Emil Lask are valuable, for example, not so much because this now obscure figure deserves a renaissance in his own right, but because Husserl’s and Heidegger’s reactions to his work promise to bring their own ideas into sharper focus in retrospect. Lask, a student of Rickert’s, approached the theory of judgment and transcendental logic — which is to say the problem of categorial form and objecthood in general — from a resolutely objective ontological point of view. He knew the Logical Investigations and criticized Husserl’s early conception of phenomenology as, following Brentano, “descriptive psychology.” Meaning or content, for Lask, had to do with objective categorial form, not subjective psychological experience.

Crowell observes that Lask’s major writings on transcendental logic “were published just prior to the development of Husserl’s transcendental version of phenomenology” (56), that is, in 1911 and 1912, immediately preceding the publication of Husserl’s Ideas in 1913. There can be no question of influence, however, since Ideas was the culmination of nearly a decade of methodological reflection and self-criticism on Husserl’s part. Moreover, as Crowell’s own notes suggest, notwithstanding some kind words to Rickert concerning Lask in the wake of his death in 1915, Husserl apparently had a rather dim view of the latter’s work. He underlined only the first eighteen or nineteen pages of each of the two books of Lask’s that he began to read at all, and complained on the basis of one such abortive effort that Lask’s Logik der Philosophie und die Kategorienlehre was, as Lask reminds him in a letter in 1911, marred by “inexactness, lack of thoroughness, burdened with equivocations” (272, n2, my translation). The fact that Lask, a neo-Kantian, adopted a “transcendental” approach to the theory of meaning, then, tells us nothing directly concerning the transcendental turn Husserl’s phenomenology took shortly after the turn of the century.

Nevertheless, Crowell’s discussion reminds us what was at stake at the time philosophically, what separated Husserl from his neo-Kantian contemporaries, and what problems beset each approach from the point of view of the other. In particular, it becomes clear from Crowell’s account that Lask was never very interested in, at least he never seriously pursued, the question motivating Husserl’s work at every stage of his career, namely, How is it possible for subjective experience to instantiate objective content? How can the objectivity of logical and mathematical thought, not to mention ordinary sense perception, be realized in the subjectivity of consciousness? It is hardly surprising to learn that Husserl found no philosophical inspiration in Lask’s aprioristic orientation, and it is striking how ill-equipped Lask was to relate the problems of logic and ontology to the concrete structures of human experience.

Which brings us back to Heidegger. Crowell sees Heidegger as allied with Husserl against Lask in his commitment to an ontologically and phenomenologically adequate account of transcendental subjectivity. Again, Crowell is right to reject van Buren’s “an-archic personalist” reconstruction of the young Heidegger as a kind of deconstructionist avant la lettre, whose “plodding scientific treatise” of 1927 was a mere “aberration” in the course of an otherwise skeptical exercise2 . On the contrary, Heidegger — both young and early — was trying to identify transcendental conditions of intelligibility, as Crowell maintains, so that it was plausible for him, at least at the outset, to follow in the footsteps of Rickert and Husserl.

But is Heidegger’s interpretation of human existence as being-in-the-world above all an account of subjectivity? I think the answer is clearly no, as I shall explain below. Nor am I convinced that there is anything especially significant in his initial willingness to invoke and endorse Husserl’s conception of phenomenology as a “science” (Wissenschaft), except as an occasion to deny the alternative prevailing conception of philosophy as mere Weltanschauung. Indeed, Heidegger abandoned the rhetoric of scientificity immediately upon establishing his professional independence when he assumed Husserl’s chair at Freiburg in 1928, and by the time of his lectures of 1929-30 his position is unequivocal:

What if it were a prejudice that metaphysics is a fixed and secure discipline, and an illusion that philosophy is a science that can be taught and learned? … is all this talk of philosophy being the absolute science a delusion? Not just because the individual or some school never achieves this end, but because positing the end is itself fundamentally an error and a misunderstanding of the innermost essence of philosophy. Philosophy as absolute science — a lofty, unsurpassable ideal. So it seems. And yet perhaps even judging philosophy according to the idea of science is the most disastrous debasement of its innermost essence.3

The fervent antiscientism of this passage was in fact part of a broader assault Heidegger directed against Husserl’s phenomenology, indeed his entire conception of philosophy, throughout the 1920s. Prior to planting himself in Husserl’s chair at Freiburg and cutting off almost all ties with his former friend and mentor, as he did in 1928, Heidegger was evidently biding his time, toeing the official phenomenological line when he could, and trying to conceal his contempt for Husserl.

In 1923, before moving to Marburg, for instance, Heidegger wrote to Karl Löwith with the following account of his presentation of Husserl’s work in class: “In the final hours of the seminar, I publicly burned and destroyed the Ideas … I am now convinced that Husserl was never a philosopher, not even for one second in his life. He becomes ever more ludicrous.” And of his lectures that summer he tells Löwith, “The old man will … realize that I am wringing his neck — and then the question of succeeding him is out. But I can’t help myself.”4 And in December of 1926, with Being and Time nearly finished, he writes to Jaspers: “If the treatise is written ‘against’ anyone, it’s against Husserl, and he saw it immediately but clung to the positive from the outset. What I write against, only indirectly of course, is pseudophilosophy (Scheinphilosophie).”5 The scales eventually fell from Husserl’s eyes, and he would later describe his realization of Heidegger’s duplicity as “one of the most difficult ordeals of my life.”6

Given the circumstantial evidence, then, it is hard to credit the suggestion that Heidegger was simply extending and deepening, even radicalizing, a philosophical project already essentially framed and set in motion by Husserl. Of course, no amount of invective in Heidegger’s personal correspondence is by itself decisive. We will also need to know how and whether his impatience with Husserl is borne out by the philosophical argument in Being and Time. Crowell describes Heidegger’s project as continuous but not identical with Husserl’s inasmuch as it aims at a “reinterpretation of the subjectivity of the subject,” so that “his view culminates in a version of subjectivity as ek-static thrown project” (54). Since subjectivity is the defining phenomenon for Husserl’s theory of intentionality, Crowell sees evidence of Heidegger’s Husserlianism as early as the Habilitationsschrift of 1915, in which Heidegger criticizes Lask by insisting that “a merely ‘objective’ general theory of objects necessarily remains incomplete without putting in into relation with the ‘subjective side.’”7

But rejecting Lask’s objectivism is a far cry from adopting Husserl’s subjectivism. Indeed, although the Habilitationsschrift is a very early text, it is interesting that Heidegger is already putting “objective” and “subjective” in scarequotes. Bracketing such terms is perfectly in keeping with his abiding suspicion of objectivity and subjectivity as prefabricated ontological categories to which modern philosophers since Descartes have tried to reduce intentionality and worldly existence. Indeed, the world-situated critique of subjectivity is as central to Being and Time as the accompanying account of the dependence of objective cognition on the skillful use of equipment in practical activity. Yet Heidegger’s antisubjectivism seems to get written out of Crowell’s account altogether. He writes, for instance, that

Heidegger does not object … to Husserl’s move toward a transcendental phenomenology, to “transcendental subjectivity” as such. Instead, he indicates the locus of a disagreement over how this field of transcendental subjectivity (or “transcendental life,” as Husserl calls it) is to be interpreted. What for Husserl, guided by epistemological considerations, must be seen as prior to the naturally posited sense “human subject” is, for Heidegger’s ontological perspective, a possibility of the human subject — not qua human (in the anthropological sense) but qua subject (in the transcendental sense) (172).

It is true that Heidegger’s project is “transcendental” in a minimal sense, inasmuch as it tries to identify the conditions of the intelligibility of things as they appear in naïve experience. But just as transcendental philosophy in this minimal sense stands in no need of transcendental arguments, neither does it entail a commitment to anything like a transcendental subject or subjectivity.

Heidegger is clear about this in Being and Time. When he criticizes Kant — and implicitly Descartes and Husserl — for forgoing any “preliminary ontological analytic of the subjectivity of the subject,”8 this is not to say that he accepts the interpretation of human beings as subjects at the outset. It is not as if Heidegger thinks he has a better account of subjectivity than Descartes, Kant, or Husserl. Rather, those thinkers already took too much for grated in interpreting human existence as subjectivity to begin with. As Heidegger says, “subject and object do not coincide with Dasein and world” (SZ 60). Of course, the term “Dasein” refers to the individual human being, and the modern tradition has conceived of human beings as subjects. But “Dasein” does not mean subject, nor is “being-in-the-world” just a description of subjectivity. Heidegger’s new terminology is instead part of a radical effort to reinterpret and redescribe those aspects of existence that conventional philosophical vocabulary tends systematically to distort and obscure. A proper account of being-in-the-world as the most basic horizon for the constitution of meaning promises to shed light on how we could ever interpret the world in terms of objectivity, and ourselves in terms of subjectivity. An account of what Heidegger calls “the worldliness of the world” must therefore precede any appeal to those categories.

One final point. Crowell suggests that Heidegger remained faithful not just to the spirit, but to the letter of Husserl’s method of eidetic reduction (199-201), and to the corresponding concepts of categorial intuition (107) and phenomenological seeing, or the intuition of essences (227-28). Heidegger clearly admired the way Husserl sought in those devices a means of undercutting the various constructions and abstractions of traditional metaphysics and ontology, particularly those of the neo-Kantians. But they find no home in Heidegger’s own hermeneutic methods and commitments. As early as 1920, in his “Comments on Karl Jaspers’s Psychology of Worldviews,” for example, Heidegger registers his distrust of any blunt appeal to intuition, in contrast to the ever open-ended work of interpretation:

The path to the “things themselves” under consideration in philosophy is a long one, so that the excessive liberties that certain phenomenologists have taken recently with essential intuition appear in a highly dubious light, which hardly accords with the “openness” and “devotion” they preach.9

Essential intuition, as Husserl describes it, can only look like a highly dubious shortcut in the ongoing effort of philosophical interpretation. For what prior interpretation of the phenomena has secured those intuitions in advance? And what authority do such intuitions have absent any radical reinterpretation of the phenomena giving rise to them?

It comes as no surprise, then, when Heidegger advances his own account of interpretation in Being and Time as a direct challenge to Husserl’s dogmatic appeal to the putative self-evidence (Evidenz) of consciousness:

By showing how all sight is grounded primarily in understanding … we have deprived pure intuition of its priority, which corresponds noetically to the priority of the occurrent (das Vorhanden) in traditional ontology. “Intuition” (Anschauung) and “thought” are both derivatives of understanding, indeed rather remote ones. Even the phenomenological “intuition of essences” (Wesensschau) is grounded in existential understanding (SZ 147).

For Heidegger, phenomenology is interpretation, and “Interpretation is never a presuppositionless apprehension of something pregiven” (SZ 150).

Husserl’s program can therefore hardly have struck Heidegger as plausible, but in need of some revision and redirection here and there. Rather, the entire effort must have looked shipwrecked from the outset. There is, I conclude, a deeper, more complex, but philosophically richer tale to be told about Husserl and Heidegger than the one Crowell tells in this otherwise stimulating and informative book.


1. Van Buren, The Young Heidegger (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1994), 25. Quoted in Crowell, 8. All subsequent unmarked page references in the text are to the volume here under review.

2. Ibid., 44. Quoted in Crowell, 8.

3. Heidegger, Die Grundbegriffe der Metaphysik. Welt-Endlichkeit-Einsamkeit. Gesamtausgabe 29/30 (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 1983), 2. The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics: World, Finitude, Solitude, W. McNeill and N. Walker, trans. (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1995), 1-2. Translation modified.

4. Letters to Löwith, 20 February and 8 May 1923. Quoted in Psychological and Transcendental Phenomenology and the Confrontation with Heidegger (1927-1931), T. Sheehan and R.E. Palmer, eds. and trans. (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1997), 17.

5. Letter to Jaspers, 26 December 1926. In Martin Heidegger / Karl Jaspers. Briefwechsel 1920-1963. W. Biemel and H. Saner, eds. Munich: Piper, 1992. My translation.

6. Psychological and Transcendental Phenomenology and the Confrontation with Heidegger (1927-1931) , 482.

7. Heidegger, Frühe Schriften (Gesamtausgabe 1), F.-W. von Hermann, ed. (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 1978), 404. Quoted in Crowell, 54.

8. Heidegger, Sein und Zeit (Tübingen: Niemeyer, 1927; 15th ed. 1979), 24. My translation. Hereafter SZ.

9. Heidegger, Wegmarken. Gesamtausgabe 9. F.-W. von Herrmann, ed. (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 1976), 5. My translation.