Husserl's Crisis of the European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology: An Introduction

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Dermot Moran, Husserl's Crisis of the European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology: An Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 323pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521719698.

Reviewed by Thane Martin Naberhaus, Mount St. Mary's University


Any book that announces in its very title that it will concern itself with a "crisis of the European sciences" immediately invites the suspicion that its ambitions are absurdly overinflated. And indeed, Husserl, in the work that has come to be known simply as "the Crisis," makes no effort to hide his aspirations -- and the sense of grave urgency that fuels them. As philosophers living in the present-day world-situation, he tells us in the first, introductory part, we have fallen into a "painful existential contradiction" (Crisis, 17).[1] Besieged on all sides by doubt about the very possibility of knowledge, in danger of drowning in the "skeptical deluge" (Crisis, 14), we know that we cannot abandon our inner vocation as "functionaries of mankind" (Crisis 17). For true philosophers are charged with the responsibility of guarding not only "the telos which was inborn in European humanity at the birth of Greek philosophy" (Crisis, 15), but also what is quite possibly "essential to humanity as such, its entelechy" (Crisis, 15), viz., the realization of philosophy's basic aim of knowing the truth about what is.

The history of modern philosophy is, indeed, nothing less than a struggle for the meaning of man, a struggle over the very fate of human civilization. And so the crisis of the European sciences is revealed to be something even larger and more grandiose (if that is imaginable): a radical life-crisis of European humanity, and of the human race as a whole. Philosophers -- the genuine ones, that is, not those fraudulent "philosophical literati" (Crisis, 17) who dominate the philosophical scene -- are the only ones suited to face up to the true struggles of our time, "between humanity which has already collapsed and humanity which still has roots but is struggling to keep them and find new ones" (Crisis, 15).

It is easy to dismiss such talk and even to laugh at it. Few philosophers operating today, surely, are able to take such ideas seriously. Dermot Moran is no exception, and so in his introduction to the Crisis in the Cambridge Introductions to Key Philosophical Texts series, he treads lightly whenever issues such as the "telos of European humanity" come up for discussion. Throughout the book, especially in his chapter on Husserl's so-called "turn" to history,[2] Moran dutifully records Husserl's deepest convictions on these matters, but he is careful to keep his distance from Husserl's more radical and controversial claims, and by the end of the book, after having played the role of honest broker for almost 300 pages, he finally allows his own skeptical take to slip out, endorsing the judgment of David Carr, who, he tells us, "has pointed out that Husserl was simply wrong to think that phenomenology, even in its most transcendental form, could save humanity" (299). That "pointed out" is an index of Moran's attitude toward the solemnity of Husserl's framing of the Crisis's task and philosophy's calling.

In the end, in other words, Moran's introduction to the Crisis by no means puts at its center the sense of crisis that seems to have inspired the work's composition. But as I said, a dubiousness regarding the kind of catastrophizing found in some of Husserl's more earnest musings about philosophy is not at all unusual, whether among Husserl scholars or those only causally acquainted with his work. And after all, the notion that philosophy could rescue the human race from the spiritual abyss into which it has plunged itself -- is this not a manifest bit of philosophical histrionics? Is such a claim not preposterous on its face, one of those unfortunate excesses to which great minds (especially German ones) are prone, but a thought that is best quietly ignored in order to concentrate on the thinker's more "credible" and "useful" ideas? In downplaying the notion that Western civilization is in the midst of a "spiritual" crisis, not to mention the rationalistic path Husserl offers out of it, in favor of such obviously fertile notions as that of the lifeworld and intersubjectivity, is Moran not simply adopting the only reasonable attitude one can take toward such matters?

The arguments supporting such an approach are clear and compelling. But perhaps it is worth asking what would happen to our reading of Husserl if we took seriously the fact that the picture he offers in the first part of the Crisis of philosophy's role in human culture and human history is clearly meant to provide a framework for understanding all the reflections that follow, not only those that are explicitly "teleological-historical" in nature, but also those concerning psychology, intersubjectivity and the lifeworld. If Husserl (who is, after all, the text's author) believed that problems relating to Cartesian dualism, say, or the positivistic direction taken by modern science, are ultimately rooted in a crisis at the heart of "European humanity" and that they cannot be adequately understood in isolation from a conception of man as having "a latent orientation toward reason" (Crisis, 15), should we not perhaps try to understand what might have led him to devote such lengthy excurses to the meaning of human life and the role of philosophy in it? And the opening sections of the Crisis are by no means the only place in Husserl's writings where one finds such thoughts. Indeed, it might even be said that for the last decade and a half of his life, when he attempted an ultimate assessment of the meaning of his life's work and of the transcendental phenomenology he had founded, Husserl was obsessed with just these questions.

One indication of this obsession is the Crisis itself, or at least Husserl's original plan for it, which his failing health prevented him from fully realizing. Moran explains (41-42) that it was conceived as a five-part work, the last part of which was to bear the title, "The indispensable task of philosophy: humanity's responsibility for itself." He notes that the conception of history underlying the text is teleological in a quasi-Hegelian sense, with the history of philosophy forming an essential part of human history and having its own "unitary teleological structure" (140). Moran rightly connects this conception to Husserl's unremitting search for essential structures, in this case historical ones: "The underlying essential a priori structures that govern the constitution of historical, communal life must be laid bare" (141). But the idea of a "universal a priori of history" is "deeply problematic" (142), and it raises deep suspicions among "those who deny a teleology to history" (141). Is there not a danger, Moran asks, "in attempting to impose a unified meaning on the course of history, when it might be merely irrational fact" (142-43)? We need not, our guide is suggesting, follow Husserl in his teleological-historical obsessions in order to derive value from the work.

If, therefore, one is in search of an engagement with the fundamental "crisis" of Husserl's title, Moran's Introduction is not the place to look. Instead, its value lies in the way it brings an astonishingly wide-ranging knowledge of Husserl and the phenomenological movement to bear on a reading of a key Husserlian text. Moran, who authored the well-received Introduction to Phenomenology (2000) among other books on Husserl and phenomenology, is a master at the art of summarizing difficult texts and distilling out of them central ideas and points of dispute. He is able to draw on a deep familiarity not only with Husserl's dauntingly large oeuvre of published works, posthumously published writings and unpublished manuscripts, but also with a vast range of other major and supporting characters in the phenomenological movement's more than century-old existence. From Heidegger to Merleau-Ponty, Fink to Lévy-Bruhl, the list of figures brought in to help illuminate various aspects of the Crisis surely numbers in the hundreds. Moran's guide book to the Crisis is sure-footed, highly readable, deeply informed, and informative -- an authoritative, reliable starting place for anyone who is trying to chart a course through the Crisis's many interwoven themes, and through the thickets of Husserl's sometimes lyrical but often overstuffed and even pompous prose.[3]

The book is not a commentary in anything like a line-by-line or even section-by-section sense, and its treatment of the text does not follow the text's own order of discussion. It is, instead, a thematically organized introduction, structured around several main topics dealt with in the text, which also supply Moran with his chapter titles: "Galileo's revolution and the origins of modern science" (chapter 3), "The crisis in psychology" (chapter 4), "Rethinking tradition: Husserl on history" (chapter 5), "Husserl's problematical concept of the life-world" (chapter 6), and "Phenomenology as transcendental philosophy" (chapter 7). These chapters are bookended by an introduction and two further introductory chapters, and a final chapter assessing the Crisis's influence. But it is the middle chapters that form the book's heart, and the themes announced in their titles are the ones that take up most of Moran's discussions.

And they are important themes, fully worthy of the attention Moran devotes to them. For example, the long, multi-part section 9 of the Crisis, which anchors part II, is justly celebrated for its influential analysis of what Husserl calls the "mathematization of nature" inaugurated by Galileo. Rightly characterizing Husserl's approach as hermeneutical, Moran notes that Husserl's reading of Galileo is heavily selective -- self-consciously so -- and he provides a useful, if brief, account of the interpretive controversies surrounding this central but somewhat protean figure in the birth of modern science. (As with most of the controversies the book touches on, Moran lays out the opposing views and then adopts a stance of studied neutrality, assuming the role of reporter rather than adjudicator.) The Galileo of Husserl's account is neither a careful experimenter nor a theorist of nature operating within a broadly Aristotelian framework, but is instead a "Pythagorean Platonist mathematician" (81) who idealizes nature in order to make it conform to what would today be called mathematical models. What interests Husserl is, as Moran puts it, "how a new 'attitude' (Einstellung) gets installed in human culture" (86). For Husserl, what is essential is the way that Galileo overlaid the world of ordinary experience with a "garb of ideas," investing it with an entirely new sense (Sinn, a key technical term for Husserl) and transforming it into the self-enclosed infinite manifold familiar to all scientifically educated people today. Moran emphasizes the role of the concept of infinity in this transformation, something Husserl does not do in section 9 but certainly had been thinking about quite a bit at the time, as is evidenced by his treatment of infinity in the 1935 "Vienna Lecture." A controversy involving Husserl, Alexandre Koyré, and the direction of influence is aired and (characteristically) left unsettled, though the reader is left with the impression that Moran sides with those who think that Husserl's account of Galileo was more influential on Koyré than the reverse.

Husserl's interest in psychology stretches all the way back to his apprenticeship under Franz Brentano, and phenomenology, indeed, in a sense begins as a kind of a prioristic psychology rooted in direct, ordinary experience. By the mid-1920s, however, it had become very important for Husserl to find a way to distinguish his own enterprise, which he was now calling "transcendental phenomenology," from psychology in all its forms, including something he calls "phenomenological" psychology, which shares its content with transcendental phenomenology but which is separated from it by a transcendental "nuance." The "crisis in psychology" does not therefore merely concern one particular science or even the broad swath of the "human" or "spiritual" sciences -- though Moran is right to say that for Husserl the problems faced by contemporary psychology are "symptomatic of the crisis in the human sciences generally" (99). It is intimately tied together with Husserl's struggle to define the transcendental nature of his philosophy and to explain phenomenology's position in the history of philosophy. And this struggle, in turn, is bound up with Husserl's struggle against naturalism and scientific objectivism -- the very themes at the heart of the Galileo discussion. It is not hard to see, therefore, why the topic of psychology would have taken up such a large portion of the Crisis text. All the major themes of Husserl's last two decades are connected in one way or another with psychology, for it is only through an understanding of the true "science of subjectivity," he thinks, that there can be any hope of advancing beyond the impasses that the sciences in many disparate fields were facing.

As welcome, therefore, as Moran's contextualizing of Husserl's reflections on psychology within the broad matrix of the psychological thinking of his day are -- there are sections on Brentano, Gestalt psychology, psychoanalysis, and race psychology -- it is hard to suppress the feeling that he has missed an opportunity to explore the deep unity of the Crisis's major themes. To be fair, the chapter on psychology contains a seven-page section titled "From naïve to transcendental science: the psychological epochē" (117-23). Here Moran traces the key steps along the route by which Husserl transforms the objective, worldly science of psychology into "the science of transcendental subjectivity." But Moran's discussion lacks the pathos that drives the Husserlian discussion it summarizes. Husserl tells us, for instance, that it was not until four years after the Logical Investigations that he arrived at "an explicit but even then imperfect self-consciousness" of the method appropriate to the phenomenological epochē (Crisis, 243). This autobiographical remark gives just a hint of the titanic struggles Husserl saw himself as engaged in as he gradually endeavored to free himself from the naturalistic presuppositions he had inherited from Brentano and the tradition.[4] For Husserl believed he had embarked on an entirely new course, and he perpetually worried that he was being misunderstood by those who lacked the eyes to see the new transcendental domain he had discovered. As he says near the end of the Crisis's main text:

the habits of thought of a centuries-old tradition are not so easy to overcome, and they make themselves felt even when one expressly renounces them. Inwardly, the psychologist will persist in regarding this whole descriptive psychology as a discipline which is not self-sufficient, which presupposes natural science as a science of bodies . . . . And even if it were accorded an autonomous existence as a purely descriptive psychology, it would still require an "explanatory" psychology alongside it (Crisis, 245)

Moran, of course, fully understands how decisive this point is for Husserl, and yet his presentation fails to accord it an importance commensurate with this centrality. The section on the "psychological epochē," for example, comes right in the middle of his chapter on psychology, after a section on ideal entities and before sections on empathy, embodiment, and depth-psychology. For the full discussion of "phenomenology as transcendental philosophy," we must work through two and a half more chapters and 100 pages, until we reach chapter 7, where Moran revisits the whole issue, this time supplementing his discussion with background information on Husserl's "transcendental turn" in the period between the Logical Investigations and the Ideas. Yet even here, the discussion quickly turns to a different topic, viz., the problem of how transcendental subjectivity can be both subject for the world and in the world at the same time. The paradox here, Moran suggests, is rooted in Husserl's theory of the transcendental ego, which "deeply alienated many of his closest followers" (238). For Moran, the difficulties associated with the transcendental ego are intimately connected to the problem of intersubjectivity and the tension between Husserl's tendency toward "egology" and his desire to give a phenomenological account of our "being with" other subjects. Moran offers solutions to neither of these sets of problems, and he even perhaps muddies the waters by bringing them into such close connection. As he does throughout the book, he carefully walks us through the main positions that have emerged on these questions in the secondary literature, leaving the reader to sort things out for himself.

Yet Husserl's discussion of psychology is clearly intended to open up the transcendental domain. Indeed, in developing "The Way into Phenomenological Transcendental Philosophy from Psychology," Husserl was recapitulating his own philosophical development, as the autobiographical remarks quoted above suggest. Even though only three of the projected five parts of the work were published in Biemel's German edition, the teleological structure of the text is clear. Husserl wants to take us through the key transformations of the early modern period, both in mathematical physics and in the conception of the mind or soul that would come to undergird scientific psychology, and show us how the resulting picture contains inadequacies and contradictions that can only be eliminated by purifying both the rationalism and the empiricism of the early moderns in order to attain the transcendental standpoint that they were all, unbeknownst to themselves, groping toward. The "historical-teleological" aspect of the Crisis is not simply one theme alongside others; it is the organizing structure of the book. More than that, it is the organizing structure of Husserl's whole understanding of the history of philosophy and his own role in it.

One has the sense that Moran finds this all faintly embarrassing, and it is certainly true that there are many other fascinating and important issues in the Crisis that are worthy of serious consideration in their own right (the lifeworld being only the most obvious of these).[5] I want to reiterate that Moran's introduction to the Crisis contains a wealth of valuable information about Husserl's "unfinished masterpiece," and those who are new to Husserl or the Crisis will surely profit greatly from his tremendous erudition. The cost of that erudition, however, is that the reader is unlikely to come away from Moran's introduction with a clear feeling for why Husserl thought that Western civilization had lost its way. The sense of crisis that organizes Husserl's text does not organize Moran's. What he offers, instead, is an extremely competent overview of the text, useful for what it does, but not rooted in the philosophical pathos that propelled Husserl relentlessly forward through his career and that resulted in a work that must, despite its unfinished character, be considered the summit of his philosophy.

[1] All quotations of Husserl’s text are taken from The Crisis of the European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, trans. David Carr (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1970).

[2] Moran notes that the characterization of Husserl as uninterested in history prior to the Crisis is a “common misconception” (149) that has been undermined by the fuller understanding we have gained in recent years of Husserl’s efforts and preoccupations during the last two decades of his life, even as he tends to perpetuate that very misconception, telling us, for instance, that before the Crisis, Husserl “largely ignored” history and the problem of communal life “at least in his published works” (143).

[3] Here is perhaps the place, however, to register some minor irritations regarding what can only be called the book’s shoddy editing. One price readers pay for Moran’s prodigious learning is that he has a tendency to repeat himself. All too often, a point is made with no apparent recognition that it had been made previously. Quotations are repeated, as are entire bibliographical citations of secondary texts. The overall effect could charitably be described as a kind of "layering." It is discernable even in the way the early part of the book is structured: first comes an "Introduction" (to the Introduction), then a chapter on Husserl’s life and writings, then a chapter on the Crisis’s composition, and then finally the book’s main chapters. Thus (to take but one example), by the time the reader has made his way through the introductory material, he has been told four times, by my count, that the first two parts of the Crisis were published in the journal Philosophia. The book also contains a surprisingly large number of typographical errors, and there are inconsistencies regarding such things as when an author’s first name and dates are given. All of this could have been eliminated by more rigorous editing -- an unexpected disappointment for a book published by Cambridge University Press in a prominent series.

[4] Husserl gives a much more detailed account of his own development in the introduction to his Phenomenological Psychology lectures from 1925.

[5] Readers are introduced, for example, to the debate surrounding the 1936 text "The Origin of Geometry," the subject of a controversial reading by Jacques Derrida, though Moran contents himself with stating Derrida’s major criticisms without either endorsing them or attempting to defend Husserl against them. Another example is the rich notion of "communalization" (discussed on pp. 154-58), which the late Husserl used to explore the transmission of culture and the "collective intentionality" that characterizes social groupings.