Husserl's Ethics and Practical Intentionality

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Susi Ferrarello, Husserl's Ethics and Practical Intentionality, Bloomsbury, 2016, 269pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472573735.

Reviewed by Pol Vandevelde, Marquette University


This book offers a rich, broad, and very well informed introduction to Husserl's ethics. Susi Ferrarello embraces the view that Husserl develops a unitary project in the different texts he wrote on ethics at various times and endeavors to show the systematic nature of this project: ethics is both a science and a practice. It is a science in the sense of a reflection on what it means to live a good life and a practice in the sense that our behaviors and actions are motivated by values. This book is a welcome addition to the growing body of studies on a phenomenological ethics at a time when Husserl's own major works on the topic are not yet available in translation (the main ones being Husserliana volumes 28 and 37).

Because Ferrarello's goal is to focus on a unitary and systematic project, she makes several hermeneutical decisions. First, she does not engage in an exegesis of Husserl's main works on ethics, but instead shows the coherence and strength of his views by situating them in his overall thought. Thus, she does not follow the chronological order of Husserl's discoveries, following the traditional distinction between the static and genetic periods. As she convincingly explains, the science of ethics that Husserl treated in his first, static period, would not make sense and would not even exist without ethics as a practice, which he discovered in his late, genetic period. Consequently, she does not analyze in detail the different stages of Husserl's views, for example in the form of a comparison and criticism, but takes a broad understanding of ethics, which she calls Husserl's "contributions to ethical philosophy" and which includes his views on axiology, the life in community, the will, the body, intersubjectivity, the relation to God, etc. In the nine chapters of the book Ferrarello discusses what she takes to be the different components of Husserl's ethical philosophy. Such a broad approach is necessary, she argues, because subjects have to be considered in their capacity to act and behave ethically in their practice as well as in their capacity to reflect on such practice.

These two sides, reflection and practice, are indicated in the title of the book. "ethical science" names "the ethics of the mind and reflection," what the author also calls a "meta-ethics" (p. 4). "Practical intentionality" refers to a "region of ethical phenomena" (p. 4) at the level of our bodies, what she calls the "volitional body." It is the space of feelings and emotions, what Husserl calls the Gemüt and what the author translates sometimes, after James Hart, as the "heart." These two aspects of reflection and practice correspond to what she takes to be the two poles of human life for Husserl, "nature and spirit" (Natur und Geist). The phenomenological task consists, she argues, in analyzing these two "ethics" in a scientific way.

Ferrarello distinguishes three parts or levels in Husserl's systematic project of ethics. There is a theoretical ethics that focuses on the "absolute ought and value"; there is a "normative ethics" that is concerned with the "material system of rules"; and there is the "technology of ethics" that is about the "mechanical applications" (p. 31).  Ferrarello makes the crucial distinction between laws and norms in order to distinguish the kind of regularities that are at play when we characterize a behavior or action as "ethical" and when we characterize a proposition or judgment as "ethical." In her explanations and arguments she expresses some excellent insights and demonstrates her thorough knowledge of Husserl's texts as well as her awareness of the secondary literature. While the discussion is rather robust and informative, the position of the author tends to remain somewhat elusive and at times difficult to follow, mostly due to a lack of precision. For example, when discussing the distinction she makes between law and norm, she uses the term "lawfulness" for both, by which she means "the necessary systematic unity of parts and whole" (p. 65). She also speaks of "normative laws" as opposed to "theoretical laws" (p. 65). In addition, she uses the terms "ought" to translate Husserl's German word sollen and "must" to translate müssen, which leads the reader to believe that the law is on the side of the sollen and the norm on the side of the müssen. However, she does not keep this translation consistent and, when using Husserl's example, writes "a soldier should be brave" (p. 66) and, some pages later, "a warrior must be brave" (p. 71), which unnecessarily complicates the discussion.

We have the same need for more precision when Ferrarello uses another of Husserl's geometrical example of a theoretical statement about a triangle. She writes:

Put … in logical terms, we would say: The triangle can be called so if and only if it has three angles; in axiological 'words' it would become: If the triangle ought to (Sollen) have three angles in order to be called a triangle, then it will have (Muessen [sic]) three angles (p. 55-56).

Now, Husserl uses an analogous example in the Prolegomena of the Logical Investigations, using the terms sollen and müssen, but there sollen is used in a non-standard sense: Soll das Dreieck gleichseitig sein, so muss es gleichwinklig sein, which the translators correctly translate as "if the triangle is to be equilateral, it must be equiangular."[1] We could say: "should the triangle be equilateral . . .," which does not force any "ought" into geometry. As Husserl explains, there is indeed a valuation, but it is about the state of affairs: we attach, he says, "value to the being of a state of affairs of a sort -- to the equilateral form, e.g., of a triangle to be determined" (p. 38). The term sollen is thus not about the fact that the triangle "ought to" be anything. As a matter of fact, Husserl adds immediately after the example: "Such a modification [to use sollen] is, however, merely passing and secondary in theoretical sciences" (p. 38). This use of sollen is thus semantically different from the other example given by Husserl that Ferrarello cites: "a soldier should be brave." At any rate, the example as used by the author does not support the view that axiology precedes theory or is intermingled with theory (the title of Husserl's paragraph is "theoretical disciplines as the foundation of normative disciplines") nor does it mean that there is an axiology in what triangles are.

The distinction Ferrarello makes between law and norm is rather important. What can be gathered from the discussion is that laws are on the theoretical side: "they convey how things are according to their foundational relationships" (p. 65). By contrast, "norms, being on the material side of the a priori, describe how things must be in order to be what they are" (p. 65). She laconically writes that "every norm is grounded in a Sollen and expresses its necessity as a Müssen . . . Ethical norms are the forms which express the practical necessity of willing: wanting the means is wanting the premises" (p. 66). She sheds some light on this when speaking of love, which Husserl considers, she argues, as a moral law, but not as a moral norm (p. 183). She explains:

Laws express an essential necessity that norms translate in a prescriptive form. Love is an absolute call to the substrate, but the norm through which we answer that call is respect and responsibility. I argue therefore that the ought is not a command, but a necessity. Therefore, it is not prescriptive because I can have the freedom to accept or reject this ought -- in other words, to decide whether and how to love or not to love my neighbour (p. 183).

This issue is quite fascinating, but we would like to know more precisely how the different levels of "lawfulness" are distinguished and according to what criteria, as well as how the logical and the ethical realms are structured and relate to each other.

The treatment of laws and norms is linked to a difficult discussion about the material and formal a priori of ethics that took place earlier in the book. The material a priori consists of the "practical necessity and laws" of affections that govern our personal choices. It is about the conditions of possibility for us to be affected and to affect others by our behaviors and actions. Because there is a basis of practice in ethics, there needs to be something material to analyze and reflect upon. At the same time, because it is an ethics and thus a reflective discipline, there needs to be an analysis of lawfulness in terms of norms and laws. What Ferrarello suggests is that, in the practice of ethics, an axiology is involved as a system of values and these values exist and have an existential or material value. An "axiology" is at play that determines the value of an object in relation to my engagement with it. As the author formulates it in a somewhat challenging way, "axiology as a formal a priori of ethics names the Wertsein (value-being) -- material a priori -- as Gutwert (good-value) -- formal a priori. This determination leads the will to decide what existential value . . . is worthy of being achieved" (p. 37). This sounds very promising, but readers are left wondering about the specific nature of the connection between the "value-being," which seems to precede, and the "good-value, which seems to be based on the 'value-being'."

This question is linked to the status of "values." Ferrarello considers that "values" are, for Husserl, objective entities with their "existential being" (p. 72). Values explain our affections and, in that sense, "express the lawfulness of feeling (gesetzmässigkeit des Gemüts)" (p. 72). The axiology that governs our praxis is the basis of "what is" in the world. "Being," she writes, "is that which can be perceived and determined by our deeds" (p. 209). She argues for an inversion of the relationship between fact and value. "Fact is something that remains unreal until it is valuingly recognized as existing (Daseinswerte)" (p. 73). She quotes Husserl (Hua XLII, 241) as support: "Moral sentiment is also the source for believing-in-the-existence of something (Seinsglauben))" (p. 73).

This is a striking and controversial view that needs further support. Are facts -- including or excluding state of affairs -- themselves subservient to values? Or is it rather only about the status of values: that values are facts and thus existing? We would like to know more about how far Husserl intended this point or how far the author wants to push her interpretation of Husserl on that point. We would also need to know what the nature of this "precedence" between two "a priori" -- material and formal -- is, which are also "precedences." Is the existential value (Daseinswert) the same as the value-being, and, if so, in what respect? When Ferrarello writes "I value the affections that awaken me" it very much sounds as if a presentation precedes the valuing and this comes close to what Husserl himself says when he writes that "values are in their essence founded objects [fundierte Gegenstände]. . . Values are secondary objects [sekundäre Gegenstände]. . . They are realities but in a secondary sense [in einem sekundären Sinn]."[2] But this seems to go against Ferrarello's position. All these questions that she raises are fascinating and will stimulate the interests of readers.

The last of the nine chapters deals with teleology and theology in a treatment that is novel and audacious. Based on her view that being for Husserl is revealed through decisions and deeds or, in her own words, that "practical intentionality is the decisional movement for the self-determination of being" (p. 210), Ferrarello defends the strong view that a telos is operative in being. Because values have an "existential value" or objective status and are directly involved in our feelings and emotions, ethics is, she says, "intertwined" with teleology and theology. She quotes a manuscript of Husserl about the progress of the true life, which tends toward "the idea of the divine life" (p. 210). The views of Husserl about God are not widely known, and it is again the merit of the author to bring attention to them. Yet, here again, because the view of ethics as being intrinsically linked to theology is remarkable, Ferrarello could have given readers more guidance in order for them to understand the exact scope of the claim. Is it a claim about values connected with an idea of transcendence or, more specifically, with a god? And, if the latter, is it a god as a philosopher's god (an architect, a prime mover, etc.) or a revealed God (for believers)? Her use of the term "theology" does not clarify the issue and raises a new question: is there, thus, a theological discourse different from philosophical discourse and, if yes, in what relation with it? Or is it only that the issue of values is philosophical as well as theological?

The excellent quality of the Ferrarello's scholarship is demonstrated by her impressive apparatus of notes that refer to the secondary literature and the different positions taken by scholars on specific points of Husserl's views. Her pedagogical virtues are also nicely reflected in a detailed bibliography that will be useful for researchers (although we may wonder about the usefulness of organizing the secondary literature by book series (Analecta Husserliana, Phaenomenologica, etc.) and by reviews (Alter, Husserl Studies, etc.), with a Varia section that comprises most of the literature).

As a last note about the quality of the copyediting, it has to be said that there are numerous typos, some infelicitous formulations, several errors in German words, some references mentioned in the text but not listed in the bibliography, all small mistakes that are normally caught by copyeditors. However, all this is only distracting and does not diminish the pedagogical and scholarly merit of this fine introduction to Husserl's difficult works on ethics.

[1]Logical Investigations, vol. 1, trans. J.N. Findlay, ed. Dermot Moran. Routledge, 2001, p. 38.

[2] Vorlesung über Ethik und Wertlehre 1908-1914, ed. Ullrich Melle. Hua 28. Kluwer, 1988, p. 310.