Husserl's Legacy: Phenomenology, Metaphysics, and Transcendental Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Dan Zahavi, Husserl's Legacy: Phenomenology, Metaphysics, and Transcendental Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2017, 236pp., $40.00, ISBN 9780199684830.

Reviewed by Thomas Nenon, University of Memphis


Dan Zahavi's most recent book on Husserl argues for the continued viability of Husserl's overall project and philosophical approach against the backdrop of contemporary discussions concerning realism vs. idealism; internalism vs. externalism; the conceptions of new naturalisms in cognitive science; and speculative realism. It argues for both exegetical and philosophical reasons against interpreting Husserl's phenomenology as a form of introspective reflection, phenomenalism, representationalism, or internalism. It also attempts to show that, contrary to common claims, the Husserlian transcendental subject is not a solipsistic, disembodied Cartesian subject; rather, among Husserl's main contributions to the tradition of phenomenology are analyses emphasizing the central role of embodiment and intersubjectivity, as well as of language, sociality, and history, in the constitution of the world for transcendental subjectivity. The exegetical work shows that the arguments Zahavi assembles here are not simply responses to recent debates, but issues that Husserl wrestled with himself as he strove to understand his own work better, including the Logical Investigations, which he was still describing as "descriptive psychology," and to explain to others what exactly his turn to "transcendental idealism" in his middle and later work did and did not entail.

What it does entail, according to Zahavi's reading, is the view that human knowledge, when successful, provides access to genuine objects in the world, including physical objects of all kinds, some of which existed before there were human beings and others which exist at a given time whether or not there are any human or other forms of consciousness that know about them. In this regard, then, one of the main topics of the book is that transcendental idealism as Husserl develops it does not entail any of the pernicious consequences of other forms of idealism, and that it is indeed able to explain how consciousness can have access to genuinely real objects better than can some recent forms of naturalism that assume a strong gap between what our mental processes provide us and the nature of the world itself independently of our mental processes. As Zahavi points out, this form of robust and straightforward realism that posits a reality completely different from and independent of consciousness comes at the expense of placing that reality completely outside anything that we might have access to, since it also assumes that we have direct access only to our own mental states.

Husserl's transcendental idealism, according to Zahavi, then accounts for the fact that we never have access to the world except through the mediation of some sort of meaning, but does not thereby assume that meanings are a distortion of the mind-independent world, but rather our modes of access to it through which being itself, including spatio-temporal objects within the world, can appear to us. Beings just are those things that appear to us when knowledge is successful, not something behind the appearances. To recognize that all objects appear to us through the lens of some meaning (i.e., are, as Husserl calls them, intentional objects) does not mean that the further course of experience cannot confirm that they are indeed genuinely real objects. Conversely, it makes no sense to talk of consciousness or mind except as a way of relating to the world that appears to it. Mind is not a self-enclosed realm but the field of experiencing in which the world is there for us.

One of the recurring themes throughout Zahavi's analysis of how Husserl's project and approach compare to various traditional and current dichotomous "ism's" is the way that this way of thinking undercuts the oppositions that are still at work within a whole range of modern philosophical approaches that are still much more wed to Cartesianism (a label under which empiricists like Locke would also fall) than they know or wish. This would include metaphysical realism that simply posits a mind-independent reality without explaining how it is that we ever know about it or have access to it (i.e. attempts to avoid the epistemic question altogether). Along the way, he also offers a number of very sensible observations about the relationship between phenomenological and empirical observations of consciousness that show how they can fruitfully inform one another.

The overall result is a Husserl much closer to Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty than many of Heidegger's remarks and most of the followers of Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty have acknowledged. It is a Husserl whose approach helps avoid the pitfalls of these oppositional debates that either end up reducing reality to some sort of mental event or posit it as something that is in every respect mind-independent but fail to explain how we can have come to know it, given the sharp divide between consciousness and being. This applies to contemporary philosophical approaches within analytical philosophy as well as within 20th century continental philosophy and more recent developments like speculative realism that have arisen more recently in continental circles. Hence the critical comparison is not just with other philosophers within the phenomenological tradition like Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, and Sartre, but also with the readings of Husserl and the philosophical positions of Hubert Dreyfus, Hilary Putnam, and John McDowell, as well as Robert Sparrow, Gilbert Harman, and Quentin Meillassoux.

This places Zahavi squarely within a recently emerging group of readers critically sympathetic to Husserl's approach who have built upon the ever-expanding body of texts by Husserl made available over the past few decades that support a version of Husserl that is much richer and nuanced than one might have supposed based simply on the texts that appeared during his lifetime. Zahavi acknowledges, for instance, Robert Sokolowski, John Drummond, David Carr, and Steven Crowell as other phenomenologists whose interpretations are consistent with this version of Husserl. The advantage of this approach is that it yields results that are not just historically significant but that also can contribute positively to the contemporary discussion of systematic issues in a whole range of areas -- from metaphysics and epistemology to meta-ethics and cognitive science.

A central question throughout the book is whether Husserlian phenomenology is metaphysically neutral or admits of a robust metaphysical realism. Zahavi's response is that Husserl's approach allows, indeed supports, our everyday realist instincts, according to which we are constantly surrounded by a world made of up objects that we often recognize but do not make or create. At the same time, as a version of transcendental philosophy, Zahavi's Husserl also acknowledges that the way that these objects show up, appear to us, has much to do with the various kinds of subjective frameworks within which they appear – and modern science itself is one of those frameworks. In fact, if one wants to refer to Husserl's metaphysics as a kind of ontology, it is important to note that one of Husserl's most important contributions is actively and persuasively to have argued against reductive tendencies to reduce everything there is to just one kind of thing, typically the kinds of things described in modern physical science.Instead, he argued for the legitimacy of a whole range of regions of things, including for instance, ideal objects like the laws of logic, numbers, and meaning; use-objects and cultural objects; other forms of consciousness life such as animals; and persons – all ontologically unique kinds of objects. Husserl's notion of foundation allows him to show how some of these kinds of objects, for instance, use-objects or persons, do indeed have what he calls a physical "stratum," i.e. features that can be described in the same terms as other physical objects, such as weight or spatio-temporal location, but that are not reducible to them. For other kinds of objects, like numbers, the project is to show how they emerge for human consciousness out of the interactions with everyday physically existing objects, but without denying their own specific kind of reality or making them real in the sense of physical objects.

This point does not figure very prominently in Zahavi's book, probably because those with whom he engages assume a metaphysics that takes nature in the sense of modern natural science as what there really is and are setting up Husserl as an idealist whose approach would preclude access to this reality, which is precisely what Zahavi wants to deny. However, Husserl's ontology accommodates nature in the sense described by modern natural sciences as a reality, as Zahavi argues, but also much, much more that Zahavi points to only in passing. In fact, one of Husserl's major contributions is to recognize the reality of all kinds of things that we encounter in our daily lives that so-called metaphysical realists will deny as genuinely real in favor of that single reality, the world described in modern physics, as the only genuine reality.

One point crucial to Zahavi's project of rescuing Husserlian phenomenology as a viable philosophical project is that, already in the Sixth Logical Investigation, but also in all of Husserl's subsequent work, Husserl sees the relationship between the intentional object (in the case of intentional objects that are intended as really existing) and the really existing object as one of identity in cases where the intention is fulfilled in the further course of experience. What is given in experience in those cases is the object itself, not a representation of it. Just to be clear, this does not mean that Husserl (or following him, Zahavi) is talking about what some call a Kantian "Ding an sich," a mistake that Zahavi and Husserl avoid, but that some of the critics of Husserl like Philipse and Meillassoux do not. They think that to be a real thing it would have to be a Kantian "thing in itself." However, there is an important difference between claiming to have access to "things themselves" as Husserl does in the Sixth Logical Investigation and claiming to have access to "things in themselves" in a Kantian sense. A "thing in itself" in a Kantian sense would not be a natural or physical object, not an object located in time and space and mediated in experience through some sort of meanings or categories. And in fact, even those who think of themselves as metaphysical realists certainly do not mean those kinds of objects when they talk about real objects. They think the real things are the ones that physics aims at, but these too are spatially and temporally located and show up mediated through a specific framework, i.e. modern mathematically oriented natural science. So what they consider the real things are also not "things in themselves" in a Kantian sense.

Appealing to a notion of Kantian things in themselves in discussions of realism vs. idealism overlooks the fact that for Kant himself, the things-in-themselves to which we do have access in a positive sense are not the objects that physics describes. They are above all human beings as free and morally responsible agents whose standing under the moral law cannot be captured in the categories of physical causality. One advantage of Husserl's non-reductionist regional ontologies is that his phenomenological approach also allows for conceptions of personhood and action in terms of motivation instead of causality, and thereby make room for freedom and robust notions of moral responsibility in his description of persons in Ideas II and in his 1920-24 lectures on ethics. In this regard, we can say that his approach does have similarities to Kant's positive notion of things-in-themselves in a practical regard.

Zahavi's discussions of Husserl's legacy in this book are limited primarily to questions of epistemology and metaphysics in theoretical philosophy. However, these brief remarks are meant to suggest that there are further areas where Husserl's philosophical project has ongoing promise as an approach to questions in practical philosophy. Zahavi's clear, well-informed, and persuasive book regarding the continued relevance of Husserl's phenomenological methodology for questions of epistemology and ontology opens up the possibility of showing how this holds for many other areas of philosophy as well.