Husserl's Missing Technologies

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Don Ihde, Husserl's Missing Technologies, Fordham University Press, 2016, 157pp., $24.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823269617.

Reviewed by Dimitri Ginev, University of Sofia


Don Ihde offers a highly original perspective on main themes of his post-phenomenology. This splendid study should be read by every STS researcher and every Husserl scholar. Borrowing from Tillich's interpretive strategy, Ihde reconstructs Husserl's "missing technologies" (i.e. the missing conceptualization of technology in classical phenomenology) by applying a kind of "temporal heteronomy" -- a juxtaposition of multiple temporal layers of interpretation which should pave the way for a non-classical reading of a classical tradition. Ihde takes the late mid-twentieth century layer of interpreting science-technology interrelations -- as this interpretation is dominated by images of the praxis and technological materiality of scientific inquiry -- and rereads Husserl's portrayal of science as a mathematizing-idealizing-objectifying project through the resources offered by this layer. In so doing, he answers the question of why classical phenomenology obviates the issues concerning the meaningful constitution of technological artifacts that on their part become tools for the constitution of meaning. But the temporal-heteronomous interpretation is a twofold movement. Reconstructively analyzing what is missing in Husserl's program helps Ihde both to resume motifs of classical phenomenology and to re-contextualize them within a program of studying technoscience in its culturally contextualized embodiments. The result of this twofold movement is impressive and rich in interesting philosophical consequences.

The central message of Ihde's temporal-heteronomous interpretation is the need for resilient and fallible approaches to the post-Heidegger, post-Mumford, and post-Ellul philosophy of technology and technoscience. The world becomes disclosed in multiple ways by techno-scientific practices, and one has to embark on an ever-evolving "material hermeneutics" in order to study this disclosedness. A motif from The Crisis seems to anticipate this message: Though Husserl remained in this work within "the analogue-isomorphic limits of instrumental technologies", he was able to see that "European humanity" has "an open infinity" of revealing world-truths. In admitting that this infinity should be a guiding principle of the post-phenomenological studies of scientific instrumentation, Ihde deals with various technologically shaped realities as they are "revealed beyond our bodily limits". For him, "with each new technology there are interrelated embodiment skills that implicate us embodied humans and for which there is a possible postphenomenological analysis." (p. 76) As in several previous books, Ihde is at his best in philosophically scrutinizing cases of embodiments in technologies. The study is full of excellent illustrations of "material hermeneutics that let the materials speak". The scrupulous analyses of Husserl's scarce considerations of scientific instruments (telescope and microscope) scattered in his Nachlass texts are supplemented by corresponding contributions to the role of Galileo's version of a compound lens telescope in reading the Book of Nature, the ways in which reading-writing technologies are embodied and culturally absorbed, and the technological practices of visualization in radio astronomy. The basic conclusion Ihde draws from his analyses,is that instruments (including those of technoscience) "maintain the connection of the sciences to the lifeworld." (p. 82)

Each of the book's seven chapters traces out a particular scenario for adapting classical phenomenology to the contexts of post-phenomenological research into technoscience. The scenarios outline different ways for overcoming "Husserl's vestigial Cartesianism", which is responsible for the neglect of technologies in their capacity to constitute new meaningful worlds. In classical phenomenology, technological tools are pure objects that by entering practical contexts (thereby becoming items of equipment) retain their ontic status of something present-at-hand. Accordingly, there is no room for "ex-static" interrelations of agents and instruments. Ihde's postphenomenology -- as substituting embodied instrumentation for consciousness -- finds instrumental transparency rather than the object-character of technologies. The new development of this program consists, first and foremost, in overcoming any gap between the articulation of local environments through embodied perceptions and the articulation of larger cultural contexts in which techno-scientific practices operate.

Ihde provides convincing counterarguments against a criticism leveled at his philosophical position. The focus of this criticism is on the "derivability" of cultural-historical phenomena from perceptual embodiment. Privileging the latter is -- so the critical argument goes -- an inheritance from classical phenomenology's Cartesianism. The unity of cultural existence gets lost even when what is at issue in Ihde's studies is the totality of technoscientifically organized lifeworld.[1] The book represents an essential step in conceptualizing the integrity of locally embodied perceptions/actions within larger cultural-historical contexts, thereby successfully countering the criticism. The bodily-proper level of analysis is not conceived of as providing building units upon which cultural practices and life-forms become unfolded. The local embodiments of technological equipment and artifacts are rather considered as being-entangled with macro-historical realities of cultural existence. This entanglement -- which is not to be re-described in causal or structural-functional terms -- is precisely manifested in what Ihde calls "multistabilities" (a concept I will discuss below). The book shows that postphenomenology is no longer agonizing between micro-bodily-perceptual and macro-cultural-contextual levels in addressing techno-scientific worlds.

While classical phenomenology is seeking invariants within the field of possible meaningful variations, Ihde's program places emphasis upon the multiple ways of reaching culturally patterned stability via making use of different technologies. He suggests a nice recapitulation of his views by stating that if the analysis of consciousness's intentionality seeks essences, postphenomenology finds multistabilities. (p. 129) This strategy involves the attempt at transferring the idea of multistability from science (theories about non-equilibrium states) to the studies of technoscience. Interestingly enough, in undertaking this attempt, Ihde follows Husserl's path of thinking. Classical phenomenology's variational method (as based on imaginative variations) has been patterned on mathematical variational analysis and the theory of manifolds. The constitution of meaning in the intentional life of consciousness results in manifolds, each of which remaining invariant with respect to an eidetic structure. By the same token, Ihde's quest for kinds of multistability in the realities of technoscience is patterned on various scientific approaches to (and models of) stability far from equilibrium. From a post-phenomenological perspective, multistability refers to multiple trajectories of technologies in diverse cultural-historical situations, provided that each trajectory is stabilized as a network of human agents and artifacts. The stabilities of technological embodiments and natural-technological hybrids are always already open to be transcended and re-contextualized within new techno-scientific horizons. These stabilities remain situated in open and ever changing horizons that constantly re-constitute them. This is why the stable networks of agents and artifacts inevitably become multiplied. The figure of situated transcendence is a hallmark of the transition from classical phenomenology to postphenomenology.

Ihde follows Merleau-Ponty in describing material tools in use as experientially embodied, thereby overcoming Husserl's treatment of tools and instruments as instrument-things. I think that the post-phenomenological approach to technoscience needs a more intensive dialogue with Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology. Intensifying this dialogue becomes especially important when what is at stake is the question of how technologies -- by promoting new embodied skills -- are transforming the human lived body (Leib). Ihde argues that each technology is distinctive in the ways it may be embodied in use. In order to spell out this claim further, he needs to pay more attention to the phenomenology of the lived body. Such an initiative would essentially enrich the anti-Cartesian "interrelational ontology" he tries to adumbrate. More specifically, Ihde's program could profit from phenomenological studies of bodily motility that concern the problematic of how different technologies are able to change (what Merleau-Ponty calls) "motor intentionality" and to design various forms of existential spatiality. Just as technologically unequipped perception (as an act of the whole lived body) is the primary opening up of the body onto being, so too the variety of embodied technologies -- which operate on the level of (what Merleau-Ponty characterizes as) "pre-personal bodily existence" -- enable new modes of bodily being in the world (i.e. new "lived relationships" to the world).

There is no (leftist or rightist or whatever) political engagement of Ihde's program. This notwithstanding, the program displays a clear relevance to the political (in the sense of the difference between " politics" and "the political"). Ihde states at the beginning of the book that certain views of Paul Forman and Bruno Latour are highly pertinent to his thesis, since both suggest ways of relating the debate about the end of modernity to science and technology. In view of this claim, I will make use of the opportunity to sharpen the specificity of Ihde's political agenda. I cannot agree with him that Forman's criterion for a postmodern situation in science-technology relations is consonant with the post-phenomenological interpretation of technoscience. In arguing that an unexpected reversal in the relation between science and technology took place in the early 1980s whereby technology gained priority over science, Forman suggests a criterion that rests on a static-objectivist view of science (and technoscience). In particular, his approach lacks a differentiation between a scientification of technological problems, and a technological finalization of scientific theories. The strong division between modern science holding sway over its technological applications and postmodern science serving technological projects is not on a par with the historicist sensitivity characterizing postphenomenology. The parallel with Latour is much more interesting.

Ihde accepts Latour's description of the "Modern Constitution". More specifically, he subscribes to the criterion of modernity introduced in Latour's We Have Never Been Modern. Under the conditions of a sharp opposition between the objectivity of "transcendent Nature" and the subjectivity of "immanent Society", the practices of mediation (i.e. the practices of creating hybrids of nature and culture) are completely separated from the practices of purification (i.e. laboratory practices that in fabricating natural facts represent them as escaping all human fabrication). In another formulation, the distinctive feature of modernity is that the representation of natural entities through the intermediary of experimental practices is definitely dissociated from the representation of human agents (as citizens) through the intermediary of social interactions. Furthermore, the Modern Constitution determines the division of labor among scientists, politicians, and those who are authorized to speak in the name of God. For Ihde, (1) technoscience is a crucial challenge to the Modern Constitution, and (2) the post-phenomenological studies of technoscience promise a way out of the nature-culture (nonhumans-humans) orders regimented by the Modern Constitution. It is my contention that (1) and (2) inform the political agenda sketched out in Husserl's Missing Technologies. Postphenomenology is not a purely academic philosophy of science and technology, but a program for deconstructing the dichotomy between the epistemologically codified science of the natural entities and the politics of those who are able to conclude a social contract -- a deconstruction that substantially redefines the meaning of the political.

Ihde's agreement with Latour notwithstanding, it would be a mistake to admit that his political agenda only specifies in a phenomenological manner the alternative to the Modern Constitution outlined by the champion of actor-network theory. The book under review shows that there are two essential differences between Ihde and Latour. First, while Latour wants to prevent the proliferation of hybrids, Ihde struggles to enhance it, assuming that it would enrich the lifeworld. He is convinced of  the potential of technoscience to regulate the production of hybrids in a reflexive manner that excludes any externally imposed political control over techno-scientific research. The second difference concerns the discourse -- Latour's comparative anthropology and Ihde's postphenomenology -- through which one would be able to restitute the unities which the Modern Constitution splits. In raising the claim that we should retain absolute Nature (as the final outcome of the modern practices of purification), while elaborating on strategies for conceptualizing and controlling the production of human-nonhuman hybrids, Latour's restituting discourse remains committed to a kind of blueprint-utopian thinking, which the discourse suggested in Ihde's book strongly denies. Latour's insisting on a "new Constitution" that -- in reintegrating the objects of the sciences and technologies as hybrids among many others -- can play the role of a new "Enlightenment without modernity", and that can lead to an "enlarged democracy" is dangerously near to a new blueprint utopia.

Ihde is famous not only for his opposition to social determinists and "technological essentialists", but also for his struggle against utopian and dysutopian blueprints. In this book, he forges further arguments for the impossibility of gaining a magic distance from the global reality of technoscience -- a distance that would allow one to criticize this reality en bloc. However, the post-phenomenological project outlined here leaves enough room for a criticism of the status quo via (what Russell Jacoby calls) an "iconoclastic utopian spirit" (i.e. a kind of projective utopianism dispensing with detailed images, visions, and blueprints about the future). A nice discussion of "global environment" as a problem that technoscience manages to contextualize in multiple ways (Chapter Four) adduces evidence of the regulative-instructive role played by iconoclastic utopianism in Ihde's critical strategy. In this discussion, he mostly pays attention to the need to keep intact the global horizon of problematizing under the conditions of growing contextualizations of the problem. In addressing the question of how to say anything about a greenhouse effect phenomenologically, Ihde alludes to a post-phenomenological constellation of scientific programs guided by non-objectivist reflexivity ("science that is able to think") and equipped with imaging technologies, and to non-shallow ecological policies displaying alternatives to economic growth and continuous weakening of established political hegemonies.

[1] See on this criticism Robert C. Scharff, "Ihde's Albatross: Sticking to a 'Phenomenology' of Technoscientific Experience," in E. Selinger, ed., Postphenomenology. A Critical Companion to Ihde (State University of New York Press, 2006), pp. 131-144.