Husserl's Transcendental Phenomenology: Nature, Spirit, and Life

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Andrea Staiti, Husserl's Transcendental Phenomenology: Nature, Spirit, and Life, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 313pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107066304.

Reviewed by Dermot Moran, University College Dublin


Andrea Staiti's monograph studies the complex relationships between the German Neo-Kantians (especially the South-West school -- Heinrich Rickert, Wilhelm Windelband, Emil Lask, and the unknown Franz Böhm) and the Lebenphilosophen (Wilhelm Dilthey and Georg Simmel) and Husserl's mature transcendental phenomenology, specifically in relation to the themes of nature, spirit, and the life-world. Staiti's overall (and justifiable) claim is that Husserl's mature work really needs to be situated in the context of his critical engagement with the then dominant Neo-Kantianism. Contemporary Husserl scholarship has tended to neglect his relationship with the Neo-Kantians.

The dialogue went in both directions. The Neo-Kantians (especially Paul Natorp and Rickert) critically reviewed Husserl's Ideas.[1] They considered Husserl to be an intuitionist who did not appreciate the value of concepts. Natorp further believed that Husserl's eidetic approach objectified subjectivity in an illegitimate manner. Husserl, in turn, criticized the Neo-Kantians in his lectures. Husserl himself replaced Rickert in Freiburg and corresponded all his life with Natorp, and briefly with Ernst Cassirer and others. Husserl thought Rickert could not explain why the experiential world is capable of sustaining scientific exploration. Husserl also wanted to develop a proper understanding of history and criticized the conceptions of time found in Dilthey and Simmel. In general, Husserl was more accepting of Marburg Neo-Kantians, especially Natorp, with whom he corresponded. He had only a tangential relationship with Cassirer. Husserl's ongoing dialogue with Kant and the Kantian tradition is evident from his 1924 address, 'Kant and the Idea of Transcendental Philosophy', delivered to the Kant Gesellschaft in Frankfurt (and published in Erste Philosophie). [2]

The focus of Staiti's book is the split in Neo-Kantianism (and thereafter in contemporary philosophy) between the justification of the legitimacy of the scientific account of the world and the manner in which the lived experience of the world can also be made scientific. A major issue, also taken up by Husserl, is to what extent "human" sciences, such as psychology or history, can be genuinely scientific. The titles of Staiti's eight chapters clearly outline the central themes: Southwestern Neo-Kantianism in search of ontology; Life-philosophical accounts of history and psyche: Simmel and Dilthey; Standpoints and attitudes: scientificity between Neo-Kantianism and Husserlian phenomenology; The reception of Husserl' s Ideen among the Neo-Kantians; Husserl' s critique of Rickert' s secretly naturalistic transcendentalism: the Natur und Geist lectures (1919-1927); Historia formaliter spectata: Husserl and the life-philosophers; The life-world as the source of nature and culture: towards a transcendental-phenomenological worldview; and, finally, Ethical and cultural implications in Husserl' s phenomenology of the life-world.

The Neo-Kantians followed Kant in accepting 'the fact' (Faktum) of science, as Herman Cohen put it, but were split on whether the methodologies of the natural sciences could be extended to the human sciences or whether these sciences demanded their own peculiar methodology. At the end of the nineteenth century, there emerged an important discussion, especially among the Neo-Kantians (including Windelband, Rickert, Cassirer), and the 'life' philosophers (Simmel, Dilthey), as well as among the followers of French positivism (Comte, Durkheim, etc.), concerning the nature and methods of the human sciences. An issue of particular importance (at a time when psychology, sociology, economics, and political science were just beginning to take the scientific forms that matured during the twentieth century into distinct disciplines with their own empirical -- and often heavily quantitative -- methods) was whether there was indeed a distinct method for the human sciences, as Windelband and Rickert maintained. Windelband, for instance, characterized the natural sciences as 'nomothetic', i.e. explaining things in terms of a general lawfulness, whereas he characterized the human sciences as 'ideographic', since they were interested in the individual as such, and in issues of value.[3] Rickert was critical of Windelband's distinction (Staiti, p. 25 n. 14) but contrasted the natural scientific push for generalization, with the sense of the distinctness and 'one-offness' (Einmaligkeit) of individual events that marks the human sciences.[4] Dilthey, furthermore, sought to contrast natural scientific explanation (Erklärung), which examines natural causation, with human scientific description (Beschreibung), which is interested in a different form of causation, which Dilthey (followed by Husserl) calls motivation (see Ideas II). Staiti will claim that Rickert's focus on method was really meant to find a way to access ontology and to clarify the ontology of the objects investigated by the human sciences (Geisteswissenschaften) as well as the natural sciences. Staiti's contribution is original in showing that Rickert's approach, while prioritizing the epistemic problem of concept-formation in the sciences, also recognized the need for an ontology of the different kinds of entity revealed in scientific inquiry. Against Kant, Rickert defended an ontological pluralism with regards to the matter of experience (Staiti, p. 34). In this regard, Rickert was influenced by Lask's Kategorienlehre (1911) which itself also had a decisive influence on Heidegger. Lask argued for the intrinsic ('subterranean') categorial structures of what is given to subjectivity, which guides the mind's structuring of the known.

In his Freiburg years (1916-1938), especially in his Natur und Geist lectures given in 1917 and repeated in 1927 (not yet been translated into English),[5] Husserl discussed his relationship with the Neo-Kantians. He and the Neo-Kantians were united in the belief that philosophy ought to be a rigorous systematic scientific enterprise and not merely a 'worldview' (Weltanschauung). Husserl agreed with the Neo-Kantians in their rejection of naturalism and in seeing philosophy as a transcendental enterprise that explored the a priori correlation between objective validity and the knowing subject. Science presupposes a conceptual framework that must itself be scrutinized. Husserl's initial criticism of psychologism in the Logical Investigations (1900/1901) expanded, especially with his move from Göttingen to Freiburg, the home of Southwest Neo-Kantianism, to an overall critique of naturalism. Husserl was invited by Heinrich Rickert to contribute an essay, Philosophie als strenge Wissenschaft (Philosophy as Rigorous Science, 1910-1911) [6], to Rickert's new journal Logos. This programmatic essay offered a sustained critique of naturalism and historicism (as leading to relativism) and set the stage for many of the themes that are prominent in Husserl's Crisis. The Neo-Kantian Jonas Cohn had written to Husserl in 1911, after his Logos article appeared, to emphasize their broad agreement concerning their 'battle-position (Kampfstellung) against naturalism and historicism'.[7] Similarly, in a letter to Rickert, 20 December 1915, Husserl commented that he found himself in alliance with German idealism (i.e. Neo-Kantianism) against 'our common enemy' (als unseren gemeinsamen Feind) -- the 'naturalism of our time'.[8] Husserl's Nature and Spirit lectures detail his differences with Rickert in particular. Part of the discussion -- which is taken up in Heidegger's early lectures in Freiburg -- concerns the nature of intuition and the question as to whether an unbiased description of what is given in intuition is possible.

The relation between the Neo-Kantians and the life-philosophers is complex. Rickert in particular attacked life-philosophy (including Husserl and Dilthey together among his targets).[9] Husserl often says he is trying to uncover the workings and accomplishments (Leistungen) of transcendental life -- so the notion of life is crucial.

Staiti explicates the notion of life in Dilthey and Simmel as focused on the "pre-reflective, pre-theoretical dimension of lived experience" (Staiti, p. 54). Staiti presents the life-philosophers as seeking a Kantian-inspired transcendental account of life, expanding -- beyond Kant -- the role of subjectivity as formative of the entire lived world and especially the unified world of historical happenings. Dilthey and Simmel sought especially to be able to characterize human life in a dynamic, holistic manner. Husserl takes over this interest in life, but believes his transcendental exploration of the life-world lays the proper grounding for the understanding of the human sciences in relation to their cultural world. Martin Heidegger, in Being and Time §§ 72-77, with reference to Dilthey, Simmel, Rickert and others, emphasized the primacy and centrality of the historicity (Historizität) or 'historicality' (Geschichtlichkeit) of human existence understood as the 'connectedness of life' (Lebenszusammenhang) shared with others in a common cultural world. Heidegger emphasizes that it is human existence (Dasein) which is primarily historical and other events are 'historical' precisely because they belong to the world opened up by the 'historizing' or 'happening' (geschehen) of Dasein. This in a way is a typical transcendental move. The historical unfolding of cultural life depends on the a priori historicity of human subjectivity. Husserl holds a similar view, especially in Crisis of European Sciences. But Husserl remained unhappy with Dilthey's historicism which he saw as leading to relativism and hence to the collapse of the mission for science. In particular, Husserl singled out Dilthey's philosophy of world-views (Weltanschauungsphilosophie) as denying the objective validity of cultural formations.

Staiti makes a very original contribution in his discussion of the difference between standpoint and attitude. The Neo-Kantians were interested in clarifying the 'standpoints' (Standpunkte) that correlated with scientific knowing and generated the frameworks that categorize the world. Husserl posited a single transcendental ego capable to adopting different attitudes. True understanding comes about through a radical alteration of attitude. The Neo-Kantians ended up postulating a plurality of standpoints understood as teleological constructions (Rickert, for example, contrasted the value-free standpoint of natural science with the value-laded standpoint of the cultural sciences). Husserl's mature phenomenology (from Ideas I) is grounded on a fundamental distinction between two attitudes (Einstellungen) -- the natural attitude and the theoretical attitude. Husserl himself has a tendency to speak of the natural attitude (also the 'personalistic attitude') as a 'primitive' or fundamental attitude shared by all peoples. Thus, in his lecture to the Kant Gesellschaft in 1924, the natural attitude is the 'original' attitude of humans living in the world, Husserl claims: "The natural attitude is the form in which the total life of humanity is realized in running its natural, practical course. It was the only form from millennium to millennium, until out of science and philosophy there developed unique motivations for a revolution."[10]

This suggests that, at least in terms of its essential character, there is only one natural attitude of humans over millennia. This natural attitude is, furthermore, the attitude of acceptance of the world. It is an unquestioning belief in the reality of the world, in its oneness, in its pre-givenness, as real, valid, constant, and so on. Staiti argues that the Neo-Kantians thought of the standpoint as productive of its object, whereas Husserl thought of objects as multilayered but uncoverable by means of different attitudes. The discovery of the natural attitude is one of Husserl's enduring contributions to philosophy.

Overall, Staiti's book is a welcome addition to Husserl scholarship. It offers a richly detailed, nuanced, and clear account of the evolution of Neo-Kantian thinking in Germany, and also its Auseinandersetzung with Husserl's phenomenological project. Staiti covers much new ground for the first time in English (It is to be regretted that so much of Rickert, Natorp, Lask, and others, remains untranslated). There are many original features, including the discussion of Böhm's 'ontology of history'. Staiti offers a novel account of the Southwest Neo-Kantian approach to the need for ontology (Neo-Kantians were presumed to be primarily epistemologists). He also takes an interesting view of Simmel's and Dilthey's approaches to the life-world that shows it to be close to Husserl's. Staiti has a very good discussion of Husserlian eidetic intuition and rebuts Rickert's and Natorp's critique of it as a pure intuition without conceptualization. Staiti makes the original -- and somewhat controversial -- claim that Husserl's life-philosophy offers a kind of "decentered" humanism. This is provocative and certainly rebuts those who want to read the epoché and reduction as removing everything that is "human" (albeit a claim Husserl himself makes in Ideas). In the final chapter, Staiti explores the ethical implications of Husserl's transcendental phenomenology and compares him with Fichte. Recent interest in Neo-Kantianism has been driven by the work of Michael Friedman[11] (in relation to Heidegger and Cassirer), but Staiti's book's focus on Husserl's interaction with Neo-Kantianism adds a new chapter to the history of early twentieth century philosophy.


[1] Natorp reviewed Husserl's Ideas in Logos in 1917/1918, reprinted as "Husserls 'Ideen zu einer reinen Phänomenologie'," in H. Noack, ed., Husserl (Darmstadt: WBG, 1973).

[2] Edmund Husserl, 'Kant und die Idee der transzendentalphilosophie', Erste Philosophie(1923/24). Erster Teil: Kritische Ideengeschichte, hrsg. R. Boehm. Hua VII (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1965), pp. 230-287; trans. Ted E. Klein and William E. Pohl, 'Kant and the Idea of Transcendental Philosophy', Southwestern Journal of Philosophy Vol. 5 (Fall 1974), pp. 9-56.

[3] See W. Windelband, "Geschichte und Naturwissenschaft," in W. Windelband, Präludien: Aufsätze und Reden zur Philosophie und ihrer Geschichte, vol. 2 (Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck, 1915), 136-160; trans. Guy Oakes, "Rectorial Address on History and Natural Science" (1894), History and Theory, Vol. 19 no. 2 (Feb. 1980), pp. 169-185.

[4] See for instance, Heinrich Rickert, The Limits of Concept Formation in Natural Science: A Logical Introduction to the Historical Sciences, ed. and trans. Guy Oakes (New York: Cambridge U. P., 1962).

[5] E. Husserl, Natur und Geist. Vorlesungen Sommersemester 1927. Hrsg. Michael Weiler. Husserliana Volume XXXII (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 2001) and E. Husserl, Natur und Geist. Vorlesungen Sommersemester 1919. Hrsg. M. Weiler. Materialenbände Vol. 4 (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 2002).

[6] E. Husserl, Philosophie als strenge Wissenschaft, in Husserl, Aufsätze und Vorträge (1911-1921), Hua XXV 3-62, trans. Marcus Brainard, 'Philosophy as Rigorous Science,' in The New Yearbook for Phenomenology and Phenomenological Philosophy Vol. II (2002), pp. 249-95..Hereafter 'PRS'. Husserl, at Rickert's invitation, joined the Editorial Board of Logos but seems to have had played no further active part in the journal.

[7] See Jonas Cohn's letter of 31 March 1911 to Husserl, in Husserl, Briefwechsel, ed. E and K. Schuhmann, vol. 5, op. cit., p. 17.

[8] E. Husserl's letter to Rickert, 20 December 1915, in Briefwechsel, ed. Karl Schuhmann in collaboration with Elizabeth Schuhmann. Husserliana Dokumente, 10 Volumes (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1994), vol. 5, p. 178. See Iso Kern, Husserl und Kant. Eine Untersuchung über Husserls Verhältnis zu Kant und zum Neukantianismus (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1964), p. 35.

[9] H. Rickert, Die Philosophie des Lebens: Darstellung und Kritik der philosophischen Modeströmungen unserer Zeit (Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck, 1920).

[10] See E. Husserl, 'Kant and the Idea of Transcendental Philosophy', Southwestern Journal of Philosophy, op. cit., p. 20; Hua VII 244.

[11] Michael Friedman, A Parting of the Ways: Carnap, Cassirer and Heidegger (La Salle, IL: Open Court, 2000).