I, Me, Mine: Back to Kant, and Back Again

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Béatrice Longuenesse, I, Me, Mine: Back to Kant, and Back Again, Oxford University Press, 2017, 257pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199665761.

Reviewed by Patricia Kitcher, Columbia University


This book makes important contributions to three interrelated projects: contemporary work in philosophy of mind that draws on the Strawsonian and Wittgensteinean traditions of Kant interpretation, the interpretation of Kant's complex theories of the 'I think,' and the relation of Kant's theories to 20th and 21st century psychological accounts of mental unity and development. Béatrice Longuenesse's goal is to show that Kant's analyses of the necessary role of 'I' representations and thoughts in cognition are philosophically correct by contrasting them with the best contemporary alternatives. She then uses later work in psychology to show that his theories cannot be dismissed as noumenal fairytales. This ambitious project involves notoriously difficult issues, such as 'self,' 'thought,' and 'consciousness,' but Longuenesse can draw on the ample resources of her highly influential studies of Kant's theories of cognition. Material from six of the eight chapters has previously been published, but the book is no cobbling together of articles; the articles address different facets of these complex issues, and deepen and clarify each other when presented as parts of a whole.

The volume begins in the present. Longuenesse focuses on recent interpretations of Kant's view that, although cognitive subjects can know themselves as objects, they cannot know themselves as subjects. Her interlocutors believe that this thesis can usefully be assimilated to Wittgenstein's insistence that there are two uses of the word 'I,' one as object and one as subject. The assimilation cannot be entirely correct because Wittgenstein takes the 'I' that is used as subject to have no referent (21), whereas Kant maintains that the 'I' in 'I think' refers (25). Still, it has seemed possible to omit Wittgenstein's no referent claim, yet appeal to his discussion of the 'I' to illuminate Kant. Wittgenstein's insight was that, in using 'I' as subject, there are no criteria of identity. In Sydney Shoemaker's canonical terminology, judgments in which 'I' is used as subject are "immune to error through misidentification relative to the first-person pronoun" (cited on 21).

Longuenesse offers a compelling and insightful objection to the more restricted interpretive strategy. It misses the asymmetry between different cases: I cannot be mistaken, with respect to the first person pronoun, about the claim that 'I have a toothache' or that 'I am engaged in proving a theorem,' but it is only the latter sort of case that grounds my capacity to refer to myself with the concept 'I.'

'Someone is thinking that this proof is valid, but is it me?' In this case, and in this case alone, the reason there is no place for this question is not that the judgment is justified by a particular kind of experience. Rather, the reason is the very nature of the process of thinking (29).

Although Longuenesse adds many details in Part II, she gives a brief account of the Kantian claims that demonstrate the asymmetry in Part I. On Kant's view, subjects have access to the representation 'I' only because they think, i.e., they consciously combine representations in other representations (B134, 135, cited on 29). In contemporary terminology, consciously combining representations occupies the unique position of making available a 'mode of presentation' of the 'I' as subject (31). It is that mode of presentation that enables humans to use both 'I' as object and 'I' as subject in (other) cases that are immune to error through misidentification (30-32). All they need in addition to that mode of presentation is the fundamental reference rule for 'I' ('I refers to the author of the thought or sentence in which I is being used,' 23).

In the Strawsonian tradition, Kant's claim that the self can be known as object, but not as subject, has been criticized for neglecting the essential role of the body. Longuenesse shows how Kant can rebut parts of these criticisms, but she also preserves aspects of this reworking of the Kantian position. Quassim Cassam has argued that awareness of oneself as a physical object is necessary to ground self-consciousness (xi), and Gareth Evans proposed that the body is necessary to ground any referential use of 'I,' including the self-ascription of mental states (23-26). Cassam's view is part of the background of Longuenesse's project, while her specific objections are directed to Evans. Longuenesse argues that, although Evans may be right about the epistemic requirements for using 'I,' he is mistaken in taking these to be part of the semantics of 'I.' She also thinks that Evans misreads Kant as having such a thin, formal notion of 'I' that it must be supplemented by an account of embodied subjects to have any meaning at all (23-26, see also 148-49). As she argues, Kant's theory implies that, in addition to having a referent, 'I' also has a distinctive sense that, again, is made available to subjects through their activity of combining representations. Longuenesse concedes, though, that in stressing the activity of thinking, she is vulnerable to an objection that bodily accounts do not face. As an activity, thinking requires an agent, but how do we know that it is the same agent in all the steps of a proof? (28)

Part II explores Kant's 'I think' in two ways. Longuenesse takes the key to understanding Kant's position to lie in following the argument of the Transcendental Deduction. That is where Kant argues that the 'I think' is both necessary for the possibility of cognition and sufficient for the applicability of the a priori categories throughout cognition. With this material in view, she can illuminate Kant's further negative and positive claims about the 'I think' in the Paralogisms chapter. There is much to learn in these rich discussions, and I can highlight only a few distinctive moves.

Chapter Four clarifies Kant's position on the 'I think' through an extended and extremely fertile comparison with Descartes' cogito. To cite just one important finding, Longuenesse makes a persuasive case that, despite Kant's criticisms of Rational Psychology, his theory of the 'I think' is intimately related to Descartes' cogito:

It is a short step from the claim I have attributed to Kant -- namely that 'I think' expresses the consciousness on the part of the agent of the unifying activity . . . to the claims (1) that the thinker of the thought 'I think' is, in virtue of her activity of thinking, the truth-maker of that proposition, and (2) that the proposition 'I think' expresses the thinker's awareness of being, in virtue of thinking the proposition, the truth-maker of that very proposition. (81-82)

As she puts it, Descartes' claim that 'I think' is indubitable is "directly downstream" from Kant's theory of the 'I think' (82).

In another highly original move, Longuenesse argues that interpreters must carefully distinguish 'I think' from the 'transcendental unity of apperception.' Although closed related, the two should not be identified. Both the A and B Deductions present three syntheses or types of combining representations that are necessary for making judgments: the syntheses of sense, imagination and apperception. Longuenesse argues that the third synthesis, that of recognizing a concept by apperception, is possible only if the representations involved in the first two syntheses remain available. Even that, however, is not enough for a subject to judge, e.g., 'This is a tree.' Subjects also need what she identifies as the 'transcendental unity of apperception' (henceforth TUA):

The unity of the mental activity at work throughout our mental life, from which concepts, and thus representations of objects under those concepts are derived, is what Kant calls the 'transcendental unity of apperception' . . . One unity of apperception is thus at work through all our activities of apprehension, reproduction, and recognition, as the necessary conditions for those activities to yield mutually consistent concepts applicable to one world of empirically given objects . . . this unity of apperception . . . is what is expressed in 'I think' (79).

Although separately describable, the three syntheses can produce cognition only if they are part of a coordinated or unified activity. That unified activity, which is the common ground of both object cognition and of the ability to use the 'I think' (31) (and hence of all uses of 'I'), is the TUA.

Since this unifying activity is what makes it possible to think about objects, there is a sense in which the 'I think' expresses it. There are, however, passages that suggest a different relation between the TUA and the 'I think.' At B132, Kant claims that original apperception 'brings forth' the representation 'I think' (104). Other passages echo B132's claim that apperception 'brings forth' something, something that is also called 'apperception,' e.g.

I am a priori conscious of an original synthesis of these representations, which is called the original synthetic unity of apperception, under which all representations stand but under which they must also be brought by a synthesis (B135, cited on 29, my underscoring. See also, B138, cited on 104).

All representation given to me are subject to this [the original synthetic unity] of apperception; but they also must be brought under it through a synthesis (B135-36, my emphasis).

Longuenesse addresses the 'two apperceptions' problem, one an activity, one 'brought forth' by activity, by appealing to Kant's distinction between the synthetic and analytic unity of apperception. As she remarks, however, her solution appeals to an unusual notion of "express" (104-105, 133, n9). I suggest below that she has resources for taking Kant at his word that original apperception brings forth a unity of apperception through synthesis.

Longuenesse's discussion of the Third Paralogism (of Personality) in Chapter Six brings out the systematic character of Kant's criticisms of Rational Psychology in a number of ways, e.g., in her comparison of the synchronic unity of apperception and 'simplicity' and the diachronic unity of apperception and 'identity' (143). It also returns to the question of the identity of the 'I' left open in Part I. Longuenesse reads the Third Paralogism as arguing that the identity of the 'I' through time is only in thought or concept:

The consciousness of the identity of the self is thus a merely intellectual consciousness, a thinking of one's own identity, or having a concept of one's own identity insofar as one is actively engaged in bringing about the unity, the "holding together" of one's representations. (144)

Or, as she summarizes her view in the Introduction, "Consciousness of one's numerical identity in different times does not have any factive meaning . . . In using 'I' in 'I think', I am assuming that in each instance of its use, 'I' refers to one and the same entity, 'myself.'" (10)

Kant, however, draws a different conclusion. He allows the notion of a 'person' that is derived from the 'I think,' i.e. that of a subject "in whose determinations there is a thoroughgoing connection of [or 'through' durch] apperception" (A365-66, cited on 152), to remain as a serviceable concept. Longuenesse argues that the disconnect between Kant's reasoning and his conclusion reveals that he has fallen into paralogistic reasoning himself! It seems to me, though, that she has resources from her account of conscious combining for a less tendentious interpretation.

Above, we considered passages that indicate that the original transcendental (power) of apperception brought representations to or under a unity of apperception through synthesis. On Longuenesse's account, the subject who combines 'p,' 'q' in the judgment 'p & q' is conscious of combining thoughts in another thought. But wouldn't she thereby also be conscious of the representation 'p & q' as being really connected to the representations, 'p,' 'q' -- as impossible without them -- and so as belonging to the same self-conscious subject, or apperception, as the representations 'p,' 'q'? In connecting representations in the cognition of an object, doesn't the power of apperception also make a real connection across the representations qua representations? In that case, the representations 'p,' 'q,' and 'p & q' would all belong to a single apperception to which they have been brought, or in which they have been connected, through the activity of combining 'p,' 'q,' in 'p & q.' The mode of presentation that gives content to 'I think' would be both conscious combining and consciousness of combining as producing a connection across representations in a single self-conscious subject; this complex 'I think' would be 'brought forth' by the TUA.

Returning to Longuenesse's case of logical proof, at each step the subject would be conscious of producing the judgment through combining other judgments, and, so, of the connection of that judgment to the others in a single subject. Since those judgments were connected to preceding judgments, . . . back to the first step of the proof, all of the judgments (steps) would be connected in a single subject. The identity of the subject could be established via the representations belonging in a single apperception -- rather than through the identity of the entity that does the combining. In a long proof, a fortiori, in a long life, the subject would need to rely on memory. What the memories recall, however, is not sensory evidence of identity, but conscious combining of representations that provides a non-sensory or a priori cognition that they belong together in a single 'I think.'

I don't know whether Longuenesse would accept this amendment. Her solution is to adopt the Strawsonian approach of using the body to trace identity (150-51). As she notes, however, the problem of identity left hanging in Part One is not that of an entity, but that of a system of representational capacities [and representations] (167, n9) and extending her account of conscious combining to include consciousness of the resulting connection across states would fit that problem. On the other hand, the identity of the mind would not merely be assumed in thinking, but created through thinking. It would be factive, which disagrees with Longuenesse's reading -- and perhaps also with the well-known footnote she analyzes in support of her reading (A363-64n, 149-50).

Although I, Me, Mine is rigorously argued both philosophically and interpretively, one of its central claims seems to me less well supported. Longuenesse takes the use of 'I' in, e.g. 'I think the proof is valid' to express the subject's accountability for the consistency of her reasoning (7, 28, 81, 107). The TUA does not merely unify mental activities and unify representations in a representation of a single spatiotemporal world of causally interacting substances, it also strives for consistency and systematic unity in cognition (105). Prima facie, though, Kant seems to locate striving for consistency, and so accountability, in a different place, among the maxims of a 'healthy reason.' 'Think for yourself, 'think from the point of view of others,' and 'think consistently' are maxims by which humans try to be epistemically responsible, by avoiding mistaking subjective grounds of belief for objective ones (5.293-94, 7.228). Borrowing Longuenesse's metaphor, being accountable and seeking consistency would seem to be "downstream" from the basic capacity to judge that requires the TUA.

Part III is dedicated to 'naturalizing' Kant's theories through appealing to the Ego and the Id, but Part I also presents material from 20th century philosophers and psychologists whose reflections on the 'I' comport with his theories. What is special about Freud is that he offered an account of how the capacities that Kant takes to be necessary for cognition and morality could have developed. In Freud's theory, the Ego (das Ich) develops from a more primitive system of representations, the Id (das Es), under the pressure of the drive for self-preservation. This new psychical structure "endeavors to substitute the reality principle for the pleasure principle . . . For the ego, perception plays the part which in the id falls to the drive." (S.E. 19:25,[1] cited on 187)

Freud mentions Kant when introducing the processes governing the Unconscious system in the "Unconscious" (1915, SE 14:170) and the Kantian echoes in his contrasts between the Conscious (later, Ego) and the Unconscious (later, Id and Super-Ego) systems are unmistakable:

The processes of the system Ucs are timeless, i.e., they are not ordered temporally, are not altered through the passing of time; they have no reference to time at all. Reference to time is bound up, once again, with the work of the system Cs.

To sum up, [the characteristics of the system Ucs are] exemption from mutual contradiction . . . timelessness and the replacement of external by psychical reality. (SE 14:186, emphases original.)

It is thus the development of the Ego that produces a system where determinate temporal relations, logical consistency and perceptions of the external world reign.

Moving from cognition to morality, Longuenesse argues that Freud's account of the development of the Super-Ego can explain a crucial feature of Kantian ethics, viz., the authority of morality (207-208). Authority is established through the 'resolution' of the Oedipal complex. In the simplest case, where a boy loves his mother and is jealous/afraid of his father, the resolution leaves a 'precipitate' of the love object in his psyche. Because the small child was completely dependent on his parents, the resulting structure has over-weening authority (219-220). Freud suggested exactly this relation between his psychological theories and Kantian ethics, when he claimed that "Kant's categorical imperative is the direct heir of the Oedipus complex" (SE 19:167, cited on 220).

Longuenesse realizes that, since Freud finds the source of morality in emotion rather than reason, Kantians will resist her strategy of naturalizing Kant through Freud. As she argues, however, the Ego or rational part of the mind is always trying to take control of behavior from the irrational parts, the Id and the Super-Ego: 'Where Id was there Ego shall be' (SE 22:79, cited on 207, 227). Longuenesse's picture of Freud as more a proponent of the Enlightenment than a fellow traveler of Nietzsche seems accurate (206), because the point of therapy is to bring unconscious desires into the realm of reason. In the Epilogue, she notes that she needs to, and intends to, do further work on the links between Kant and Freud, and on the soundness of Freud's theories (233). However that new project turns out, I, Me, Mine already brings an enormous amount of penetrating light to topics and texts that are in desperate need of it.

[1] The Standard Edition of the Complete Psychological Works of Sigmund Freud.  James Strachey et. al., eds., 24 Vols., Hogarth Press, 1953-74.