I: The Meaning of the First Person Term

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Maximilian De Gaynesford, I: The Meaning of the First Person Term, Oxford University Press, 2006, 198pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199287821.

Reviewed by Richard Vallée, Université de Moncton


De Gaynesford takes a second look at what has become the standard view in the philosophy of language: the idea that "I" is a pure indexical, a term having a linguistic meaning determining different referents for different tokens or utterances. The book blends history of philosophy (Descartes, Kant), classic contributions to the semantics of "I" (Russell, Wittgenstein, Anscombe and Strawson) and more recent views (Kaplan). It is also heavily influenced by ordinary language philosophy. Chapter 1 is a brief survey of the role of "I" in the history of philosophy. The first part of the book is mainly dedicated to a presentation and criticism of three contentions the author sees as the orthodoxy. First, Rule Theory (Chapter 2): a rule, like "the speaker of the utterance" or something similar, gives the meaning of "I" and "determines the referent of any use of that term" (p.4); second, Independence (Chapter 3): there is no need to identify the object referred to when uttering "I"; third, The Guarantee (Chapter 4): an utterance of "I" cannot fail to have a referent. Together, these three stands constitute what he calls Purism. In the second part of the book, a view of "I" as demonstrative is argued for. The positive suggestion does not discard the idea that a rule is at work as far as "I" is concerned. However, it contends that such a rule does not give the meaning of "I", and is not reference determining. It just raises to salience what makes the utterance true. If something like "the speaker of the utterance" does not determine the object referred to by an utterance of "I", then the latter might not be the utterer. On this picture, using "I" requires identification of the object designated. In addition, "I" does not semantically guarantee that the utterance cannot fail to have a referent. However, De Gaynesford rejects the possibility of reference failure and offers what he calls a pragmatic explanation for this feature of "I". Arguing against the very simple ideas backing the orthodoxy requires strong intuitions and clear arguments. The book does not fare very well in this respect. The proposed alternative must be as simple and as plausible as what it replaces. Most semanticists will not be convinced by the suggested view.

Rule theory is clearly semantic in nature. The Guarantee, on the other hand, has less to do with the idea that a rule gives the meaning of "I", and determines the referent of an utterance of "I", than with the fact that the specific rule we are interested in gives a condition satisfied by a unique speaker, refers to an utterance, and that an utterance is defined by the use of a sentence by a speaker, at a place, at a moment of time. If there is an utterance, then there is a speaker -- hence, the close, intuitive semantic relation linking the meaning of "I" to the speaker. Independence, focusing on identification, is epistemic in nature. In Chapter 1, it is suggested that each doctrine gives the others some support. In my understanding, Rule Theory is the key player in semantics, and the two others are just direct consequences of it. De Gaynesford, by putting them together, is less interested in semantic issues than in a nest of philosophical, especially epistemic and metaphysical, problems gravitating around "I". Purism brings together semantics and epistemic issues. However, recent philosophical work on "I" keeps them apart.

The criticisms against Rule Theory are not convincing. De Gaynesford contends that advocates of the Rule Theory offer only a few arguments in favor of their view (p. 30). Kaplan's Demonstratives, as well as Perry's early papers, contain many arguments in favor of Direct Reference and Rule Theory, arguments not addressed in the book. Kaplan is introduced as a representative of that approach. However, the presentation of Kaplan's view is very brief and not well informed. De Gaynesford sees a problem in the idea that the meaning of "I" is referent determining, since that leaves no room for intentions. But "I" clearly leaves no room for intentions in reference determination. He then examines various rules found in the literature, things like "The producer of the utterance", and argues (p. 40) that a rule like "Uses of "I" refers to those who use them" is ambiguous in three ways. ""I" refers to the person using it" would be a better formulation of a plausible rule. Now, I really fail to see these ambiguities in the stated rule and, for example, how the rule might mean something like "for every use of "I" which has a user, the use will successfully refer to the user" (p. 40). Can a use of "I" be without a user? He would also question the use of "producer" in my example, distinguish user and producer, and introduce an ontological issue -- is the producer, or user, a body? a person? a human being? -- and a role issue -- is it the speech writer who wrote the "I" read by a politician? The politician reading it? Or the evil genius controlling his mouth and forcing him to say "I"? He, of course, adds quotation and fictional use of "I", by an actor, for example. I do not see why these are problems for the rule theory since the latter requires only that an object determined by the meaning of "I" makes true an "I"-sentence utterance. In contrast with what is assumed in the book, I do not see "what kinds of thing "I" refers to" (p. 13), as a serious semantic issue. I remain unconvinced that much weight should be put on these examples. There are interesting ontological problems around "I", but I doubt that they are connected to the semantics of "I" and/or can be solved by examining the semantics of "I". The discussion on context (p. 44) focusses on the Answering Machine Paradox. However, the problem is not well introduced and does not echo the sophisticated debates found in the literature (Perry, Predelli). Finally, the book does not address the principle underlying Rule Theory: the idea that a rule, or the linguistic meaning of "I", determines the referent of a token or an utterance of that term, the referent being part of the truth conditions of a token or an utterance of a sentence containing that term. In my understanding this is the essence of Direct Reference Theory. Specific formulations of the rule found in the literature are rightly questioned, but the principle underlying these formulations never is. It is hard to figure out why Chapter 3 is opened by saying that Rule Theory is a dead end.

De Gaynesford takes Independence, the doctrine that one need not identify oneself when using "I", to be offered as an explanation for what ordinary language philosophers (basically, Wittgenstein and Strawson) call nonsensical questions, questions like "Are you sure that it is you who is in pain when you say "I am in pain"?" He rejects the doctrine because what it explains is a cloud of examples -- "is not in good order" (p. 61) -- not really requiring Independence. This is a not a convincing argument. I am not sure that the theory is motivated by these examples. In addition, that the problems allegedly motivating the introduction of a theory are unclear does not provide reason to contend that the theory itself is unclear and wrong. A pragmatic explanation is offered to account for these examples: "a convention to ask whether one has got the reference right only when there is, and because there is, an evident possibility or likelihood of one's having the reference wrong" p. 59). This piece of ordinary language philosophy is not a serious alternative to what is a consequence of the semantics of "I". De Gaynesford contends that (i) referring "is a kind of identification" (p. 58), and that (ii) to express a thought about oneself by using an "I"-sentence one must be able to identify oneself (Chapter 3). (i) is not part of the semantics of "I" or the orthodoxy, and the argument behind (ii) is obscure. He also writes that he wants to focus on the meaning of "I", not on the thoughts it expresses. However, he heavily invokes thoughts expressed by utterance of "I"-sentences -- without saying much about such thoughts -- to support the views for which he argues.

Finally, The Guarantee is rejected on different grounds. "Arguments for The Guarantee imply Rule Theory. But the latter doctrine is false, as we know. So the former must fail" (p. 76). At this stage, some readers might not be convinced that the Rule Theory is false. De Gaynesford argues that The Guarantee makes some questionable assumptions: "that anyone who speaks will know both that there is a speaker and who that speaker is" (p. 77), for example. Amazingly, The Guaranteee does not mention knowledge, and without new premisses, it does not imply anything with respect to speaker's knowledge. Alternatively, he argues that it relies on the questionable idea that "merely speaking I is sufficient to give the use determinate reference" (p. 77). But if an utterance of "I" refers to the speaker of the utterance, it is hard to question that point: there is bound to be a determinate referent, as recognized by De Gaynesford himself. This is the case, whether you call the referent the speaker, the user or the agent. And the reason why there is a referent is that the meaning of "I" is context sensitive and tokens or utterances are bound to be found in contexts where there is a speaker, a user or an agent,. Call it a semantic or a pragmatic feature of "I" if you want. But the link is tighter than an empirical link, and rightly tighter than what salience will ever provide. In addition, you do not want the strong link between an utterance of "I" and its referent to be an empirical coincidence, and you may want the meaning of "I" to have a role to play here. Finally, it is argued that "features of any occasion of utterance ensure that no use of "I" could fail to refer" (p. 80). If this does not mean that features of any utterance of "I" guarantee that an utterance of "I" has a referent, then I am lost. But this is exactly what The Guarantee states. The reader cannot be anything but perplexed when he adds that The Rule Theory is not enough to get a referent, and that pragmatic features must be added (p. 80).

What is the positive suggestion? A demonstrative or deictic determines a specific referent by making it salient, and more precisely referentially salient, and each act of using a deictic is an act of making an object salient. On that view, "Salience is not relative to observation", and an object might be salient even if not observed (p. 125). According to De Gaynesford, some utterances of demonstratives just don't need a demonstration to make an object salient, as in the example "that tree" in a one-tree world. There might also be a candidate to salience because of previous discourse. So, demonstrations are not necessary features of demonstratives. The former just "help secure the determinacy of reference" (p. 115) of the latter. In the case of "I" as a demonstrative, uttering that term makes the referent salient (p. 130). On that picture, salience plays a very important role, but remains to me an evanescent notion. Now, having a salient object does not imply that this object has been discriminated and/or identified. Chapter 10 is an examination of how an utterer of "I" identifies the object referred to/made salient by his utterance as the object he is really thinking about. This is the main issue in the last chapters of the book. In Chapter 11 we have an answer to that question: some form of perceptual awareness of oneself through proprioception. If one makes an utterance of "I", one knows that one is making this utterance. This chapter is mainly in the philosophy of mind, and includes a long critical discussion of Shoemaker on awareness. De Gaynesford's perspective on "I" downplays reference determination and semantics. It emphasizes identification of the utterer and epistemic issues linked to knowledge of oneself and self-consciousness, and what prompts an utterance of an "I"-sentence. In that respect, it is much closer to philosophy of mind than to semantics, and it brings "I" back to more traditional problems raised by ordinary language philosophers.

This is the first book-length study of "I" adopting a perspective not inspired by Frege. De Gaynesford takes into consideration many different views and examines various issues without relying on recent semantic principles. For this reason, his suggestion will not be convincing for those keen on the Direct Reference Theory framework. It is also sad that the author does not address some very difficult issues raised by demonstratives and indexicals: for example, the fact that "I" is not clearly linked to representations of oneself, how "I" is tied to proprioception and how to report first person thoughts. Even if explicitly not addressing first-person thoughts, De Gaynesford assumes them, and a sketch of his view on that topic would have made his case stronger. Despite all my reservations, I want to emphasize that De Gaynesford's broad philosophical concerns, clearly anchored in ordinary language philosophy and reaching philosophy of mind, are very legitimate and deserve attention. There is much to be learned from this book. It will remind hard-core Direct Reference theorists that the motivations behind their work in semantics go deep into epistemological and metaphysical problems, and that their audience expects them to address these issues.