I Was Wrong: The Meanings of Apologies

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Nick Smith, I Was Wrong: The Meanings of Apologies, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 298pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521684231.

Reviewed by Matthew Talbert, West Virginia University


In I Was Wrong, Nick Smith identifies and characterizes the elements that combine to form meaningful, morally significant apologies. Additionally, Smith analyses the inadequacies of evasive, insincere, or otherwise defective apologies. Indeed, this book is perhaps most valuable as a field guide to inadequate apologies -- that is, apologies that omit some element of an ideally meaningful apology. Some of the practices with which Smith takes issue will be familiar to anyone who pays attention to the lives of public figures, and Smith's discussion is enhanced by a wealth of real-life examples involving such figures. Most of us have heard misbehaving politicians or celebrities offer vague admissions that "mistakes were made" or expressions of regret that "people were offended." Smith aims to impose order and precision on our intuitive sense that something is amiss in these supposed apologies.

A significant feature of Smith's book is his elaboration of the concept of a "categorical apology," which is Smith's "benchmark for apologetic meaning" (142). Among other things, a categorical apology typically occurs only when the person most proximately responsible for an unjustified harm issues an apology to the one who actually suffered the harm: the performance or acceptance of an apology by intermediaries tends to dilute its impact and moral significance. Moreover, the one who apologizes should identify the harms she caused with some precision and detail; otherwise, the apology is likely to be at most incomplete. The apologizer should also accept blame for what she did and should explicitly acknowledge the moral principles that were violated by the harm in question. A categorical apology should also issue from sincere regret for the wrong committed and should be accompanied by an affirmation of the recipient as a moral interlocutor who did not deserve the treatment to which she was subjected.

Smith's account of how the various aspects of the categorical apology contribute to an apology's meaning is rich in detail, nuance, and good sense. The same is true of Smith's account of the unsatisfactory nature of apologies that fall away from the categorical ideal in one way or another. However, the attention paid to, and the number of pages spent on, delineating the features of the categorical apology may strike some readers as going beyond what is necessary to make Smith's point. For instance, many readers will promptly agree with Smith about the important differences between accepting blame and merely expressing sympathy and with his observations about the ways in which imprecise or responsibility-shifting apologies are unsatisfying. Moreover, the interdependence of the various elements of the categorical apology often leads Smith to reiterate themes to which he has already given sufficient attention and that may have seemed largely uncontroversial to begin with. Of course, our concept of apology can stand to be deepened and refined, but if a reader is inclined, for example, to think that sincerity does not matter much in an apology, then it is not clear that Smith's invitations to share his intuitions about examples of insincere apologies will do much to address this disagreement.

On a similar note, while Smith is right that we often encounter apologies that are offensively insincere or otherwise inadequate, it is not always clear for whom Smith's cautionary examples of such apologies are intended. On the one hand, it is not likely that the celebrity who says, "I'm sorry people were offended," is really acting under a mistaken impression about what constitutes a meaningful apology. Presumably, people who say such things are often aware that their utterances are not what offended parties are looking for. I also suspect, on the other hand, that most recipients of these apologies are not in great danger of being deceived into thinking that they have gotten a meaningful statement of apology. Smith probably views this jaundiced attitude on the part of both parties as itself problematic and this is no doubt the right attitude. However, if both parties in the above example already agree with Smith about the deficiency of the apology in question, then it is unclear that I Was Wrong will do much to improve the situation.

Smith occasionally juxtaposes his own views against those of other authors. He suggests, for instance, that his "characterization of categorical regret as central to apologetic meaning," is "a minority position in apology scholarship" (69). Such a conflict with dominant views would certainly justify Smith's emphasis on themes (like the significance of sincere regret) that may seem unremarkable to a layperson. However, Smith is perhaps overstating his disagreement with the majority position. For Smith, the centrality of regret to apologetic meaning has largely to do with the fact that we -- the recipients of apologies -- often care about whether an apologizer expresses regret and about whether he is sincere in so doing. I imagine that for most people, it alters the subjective significance of an apology to learn that it was insincere. I imagine too that not many philosophers are keen to deny that recipients of apologies often find a special significance in apologies they regard as accompanied by genuine regret.

It is true, as Smith notes, that Richard Joyce claims in his paper "Apologizing" that "an apology only requires 'adequately convincing affectation'" of regret (69). But Joyce is discussing here a collective apology delivered by a "formal apologizer."[1] Joyce says that while we might prefer some sort of "emotional engagement" on the part of a formal apologizer, we are more interested in practical matters such as whether the offending institution reforms its policies and behavior.[2] Perhaps Joyce overstates our interest in practical outcomes, but what he says does not entail a commitment on his part to viewing sincere regret as an insignificant feature of apologies, at least not in the case of person-to-person apologies. Indeed, Joyce says in his next paragraph, "[s]incerity is not a necessary component of an apology, though it is certainly usually a desirable feature, for both individual and group apologies."[3] Joyce's point seems mainly to be that sincere regret is not a necessary condition on an utterance counting as an apology and that insincere apologies can often play useful social functions. But this position is consistent with recognizing that sincere regret is often crucial to apologies insofar as people who seek apologies often seek sincere apologies.

While Smith is critical of philosophers like Joyce who emphasize the instrumental roles that apologies can play, he is also careful to "not deny that even the most deceptive and disingenuous apologies serve important social functions, but surely," Smith adds, "they do not provide certain forms of meaning" (93). But this last claim is fairly weak if it means just that insincere apologies, while they can accomplish desirable ends, often fall short of being the sort of apology for which most people are looking. Even a philosopher like Joyce, who highlights the instrumental nature of apologies, can admit this last point.

Two related discussions dominate Smith's book. The first, as we have seen, involves delineating the elements of the categorical apology; the second discussion focuses on the possibility of a collective categorical apology. Smith believes that collective categorical apologies can occur in exceptional instances, but they "are even more uncommon than individual categorical apologies" (155). This is because fulfilling the conditions of categorical apology is especially difficult for a collective. Some aspects of this difficulty involve the nature of collectives and our uncertainty about attributing intentional states to such entities. For example, while acceptance of blame is an aspect of a categorical apology, it will often be difficult to say whether a large collective, perhaps with a complicated internal hierarchy, has accepted blame. There are also practical obstacles to categorical collective apologies. For one thing, according to Smith, categorical apologies should offer detailed accounts of wrongs done, but this becomes very difficult in cases of the sort of large-scale, multi-faceted wrongdoing of which collectives are capable. To take a frequent example of Smith's: imagine the difficulty of cataloguing the wrongs and wrongdoers involved in the Rwandan genocide and of weaving these into a single apology.

As Smith notes, in some cases, a collective's failure to issue a fully categorical apology may not be very significant. For example, "victims may be more interested in assuring their future well-being than in properly ascribing blame for the past," thus "the meaning of the categorical apology might seem comparatively inconsequential in such a context" (220). Indeed, from a standpoint that values social cohesion and reconciliation, it can often be positively salutary to avoid the sort of "protracted causal analysis" and detailed assignment of blame that can accompany a categorical apology (203).

However, and despite the preceding concessions, Smith is generally mistrustful of collective apologies precisely because they often fall short of the categorical ideal. Smith is interested, for example, in drawing our attention "to how many political, corporate, and other group declarations stretch the notion of apology so thin that it lacks most of the moral force characteristic of categorical apologies" (157). Such concerns lead Smith to conclude that collective apologies are often "poor substitutes for categorical apologies from individual members of the group" (185-86).

One of Smith's particular concerns has to do with the way in which wrongdoers can obscure their individual blameworthiness by burying it in a collective apology. Smith worries that "a metaphorical understanding of the collective's culpability will supplant the literal blame that should be ascribed to living individuals" (185); that collective apologies "allow wrongdoers to diffuse blame into the ether of institutional doublespeak" (199); that those who are most culpable for an institution's behavior will "deflect their individual wrongdoings into the culpability of the collective" (223). Stated in the most general terms, Smith's worry seems to be that collective apologies allow individuals or institutions to get away with something: to reap the benefits of offering a full apology without having done so.

Smith attributes the significant attention he pays to "finding faults with collective apologies" to his "frustration with so many occasions where institutions squander opportunities to enrich public discourse with morally reflective acts of contrition" (246-47). However, to the degree that a reader shares Smith's frustrations, she may find some of his cautionary examples of inadequate collective apologies to be unnecessary. It is likely that many of Smith's readers already share the view that collective apologies are often at most formal or partial apologies; as such, these readers are not in too much danger of falling into the sorts of deception with which Smith is concerned. In fact, Smith himself notes that "[c]orporate apologies … immediately strike many as disingenuous. We understand that corporations seek to maximize profits and we suspect that apologies are but a calculated means to this end" (239-240, emphasis added). We are, moreover, "only slightly less dubious of collective political apologies, which trade in political as well as economic capital" (240). If, as Smith claims, "collectives often serve … an unsatisfying dish," then perhaps he need not be too worried that those presented with this dish are satisfied by it (199).

Of course, this still leaves our shared consternation at the fact that so many obviously unsatisfying apologies are blithely offered up to the public. But, as I suggested above, the public institutions with which Smith is frustrated are not likely to be issuing inadequate apologies because they are uninformed about the nature of apology; presumably, they are well aware that their apologies do not live up to anything like Smith's categorical ideal.

I have criticized Smith for occasionally laboring over claims or concerns in more detail than is necessary given the intuitive appeal of his position. But I should conclude by emphasizing that this criticism correlates with, and should not overshadow, a significant virtue; namely, that Smith provides us with a comprehensive and eminently sensible sourcebook on apologetic meaning. Smith has done a service by offering extensive and clearly written analyses of many aspects of apology as well as a great number of compelling and detailed examples. We have here, if not a completely new way of thinking about apology, an accurate guidebook to the many subtle ways apologies can succeed or fail.

[1] Richard Joyce, "Apologizing," Public Affairs Quarterly, 13 (1999): 159-173.

[2] Ibid., p. 166.

[3] Ibid., p. 167.