Ibn Sina's Remarks and Admonitions: Physics and Metaphysics: An Analysis and Annotated Translation

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Shams C. Inati, Ibn Sina's Remarks and Admonitions: Physics and Metaphysics: An Analysis and Annotated Translation, Columbia University Press, 2014, 218pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231166164.

Reviewed by Jules Janssens, De Wulf-Mansion Centre, KU Leuven


Ibn Sīnā (ca. 980-1037), known in the West as Avicenna, is one of the major figures of the history of philosophy. He wrote several encyclopedic philosophical works, most famous among which was his opus magnum al-Shifā', The Book of Healing. But he wrote also several minor encyclopedic philosophical works. One of these is al-Ishārāt wa-l-Tanbīhāt, which is generally considered to be a later works, and therefore an expression of his mature thought. It is a work that Ibn Sīnā addressed to his disciples as a kind of workbook. Instead of developing fully articulated arguments, he mainly offers 'suggestions' by which he invites his disciples to establish in a correct way the final conclusions and/or the way to reach them. This makes it a very demanding text for the contemporary reader, one that is not always easy to understand. It is therefore no surprise that until recent times the text had only once been translated into a modern Western language, i.e., French. In fact, A.-M. Goichon has the tremendous merit of having offered for the first time such a translation in 1951.[1] However, since the publication of that translation, the research on Ibn Sīnā has made great progress, as shown by the large number of publications on his thought, and especially the availability of many primary texts in printed editions.[2] In view of this, Goichon's translation is frequently open to serious questioning. Nevertheless, on occasion it is still helpful for grasping the meaning of difficult passages.

With the present translation of what she labels the "physical and metaphysical" parts, Shams Inati completes her translation of the work, thus making it for the first time completely available in the English language.[3] As such, she has accomplished an extraordinary work that undoubtedly deserves admiration, and even gratitude. On several occasions her translation turns out to be much more adequate than Goichon's. However, Inati, unfortunately, bases her translation on one of the weakest existing editions of the Arabic text, namely Sulayman Dunyā's. Certainly, she does -- in our view, too seldom -- refer as well to J. Forget's text, but completely ignores M. Zāre'ī's valuable edition.[4] Moreover, although she refers now and then to Goichon's work, she has not taken advantage of that work as much as she might have done. Finally, the translation is sometimes in flagrant contradiction with what the Arabic text affirms. It is therefore clear that it remains open to (serious) improvement, even if some of its parts are (very) valuable.

A first serious problem rises with the translation of the title. Although Dimitri Gutas discusses this at length, giving serious reasons in favor of the translation 'Pointers and Reminders', Inati in no way deals with this issue.[5] This is simply regrettable, given that the title directly expresses the very nature of the work.

Before starting the translation proper, Inati gives a basic analysis of the contents of the chapters translated here. Generally speaking, it offers a valuable survey of the major topics discussed. Moreover, it provides the necessary background of Ibn Sīnā's broader theory. Finally, it points to the Greek background of some of Ibn Sīnā's ideas. But the identification of the Avicennian idea of Providence with that of Plotinus is probably in need of qualification. Certainly, nobody will deny that there are elements of Neoplatonic influence in Ibn Sīnā's thought, but it is not easy to delimitate them in a precise and correct way. More is needed than pointing to some similarities between the views, as Inati does. Also open to discussion is Inati's explanation of Ibn Sīnā's use of Qur'anic terminology. In her view, it is purely rhetorical, since it has no other goal than to give an Islamic appearance to the doctrines expressed. But this is far from obvious, as evidenced in the great commentary on the Qur'an of Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī (12-13th. cent.). Indeed, Ibn Sīnā's commentary on the Light Verse, as given in the present work, is there quoted as certainly an 'acceptable' one. Surprising -- and, on any view, seriously questionable -- is Inati's affirmation that "Contrary to the Aristotelian tradition, the Physics closes with a discussion primarily concerned with the soul" (p. 15). First of all, it has to be noted that one looks in vain in the Arabic editions for the title 'Physics'. Dunyā mentions 'ṭabī'iyyāt'. However, this is almost certainly something he added. Furthermore, it is absolutely not unusual in the Aristotelian tradition to consider the discussion of the soul as part of the 'natural sciences'; on the contrary, this is the common practice. So, the discussion of the soul in the context of natural sciences is clearly in line with the Peripatetic tradition, as further exemplified in other works, as, e.g., his Najāt, or his Dānesh-Nāmeh, where he also ends the section on the natural sciences with an account of the soul.

As to the annotation of the translation, it gives the immediate impression of being too limited, especially given the extreme difficulty of the text. To illustrate this, two examples may suffice: (1) The title of the first class, Namaṭ, is translated as 'On the Substance of Bodies'. It would have been worthwhile to note that 'substance' here translates the Arabic word tajawhur and hence refers to the affirmation that bodies are truly substances, as Goichon (p. 147, n. 2) has already noted; (2) As to note 17 (p. 203) to the translation of chapter 10 of the seventh class, it simply states that the (Arabic) text has: Ḥashf kulluh (read: Ḥashaf kulluhu), without indicating that Ḥashaf literally means 'bad dates'. Of course, this kind of information is not strictly required, but it would clearly have facilitated the understanding of the text, especially for those readers who do not know Arabic. In one case, one has to deal with a clearly mistaken understanding of Goichon's French translation, namely in note 15 to the sixth class (p. 199). Inati renders Goichon's French translation of the title of ch. 15, which runs as follows: 'Sur la multiplicité des Intelligences qu'imitent les âmes célestes', as "Regarding the multiplicity of Intelligences that imitate the celestial souls". If this were the correct rendering of the French, Goichon would have indeed made a major mistake. But this is clearly not the case. The French does not have 'qui imitent', as would be required by Inati's translation, but rather 'qu'imitent', which unambiguously makes the Intelligences, referred to by the relative pronoun 'que', the object of the imitation.

The translation itself is written in a very readable English and is on many occasions more accurate than Goichon's. However, it does not always take advantage of the latter. I limit myself here to one case by way of example. In the penultimate line of the translation of ch. 17 of class three, one reads "representation (of this form)". The Arabic text has: 'rasmuhā wa-rashmuhā', rendered by Goichon (p. 336) as 'son esquisse et sa marque' (its sketch and its distinguishing mark). Goichon notes moreover that the former of the two terms is related to the sensible, the second to the imaginary. In other words, the English translation is not completely mistaken, but it does not do full justice to the (complex) underlying Arabic expression.

Regrettably, on several occasions the translation is definitely wrong, or at least highly interpretative. In what follows, I limit myself to the most striking cases.

(1) Chapter 23 of class 1 starts with the following affirmation: "You know that if the corporeal form separates from matter and is not substituted (by another corporeal form), then matter ceases to exist". The Arabic text does not mention the notion of corporeal form (al-ṣūra l-jismiyya), but instead speaks of substantial form (al-ṣūra l-jawhariyya). The terminological switch in the Arabic seems to me not to be fortuitous, but rather indicative of a conscious choice (especially given that the term does not occur often in Ibn Sīnā's writings; but see, e.g., al-Shifā', al-Samā' wa-l-'Alām, Cairo, 1969, pp. 31,15-32,7). Whether Ibn Sīnā considers it as synonymous with 'corporeal form' is certainly not evident and requires a detailed examination of his (complex) theory of the matter-form relation.

(2) In the middle of ch. 4 of class 3, it is stated: "If, on the other hand, you assert your act as an act of yours, you have not thereby asserted yourself by itself". This might suggest that Ibn Sīnā distinguishes a kind of self-affirmation (or: self-awareness) that occurs through one's own essence, and is unrelated to any act, even an act recognized as one's own. But he clearly expresses in this chapter that self-awareness is related to the apprehension of an act as one's own act, hence that it is inherent in the experience of other things, though with the important qualification that it occurs together with the experience, and is not constituted by it.[6] The 'bihi' of the Arabic text unambiguously refers to the 'act recognized as your act', and hence has to be translated: 'by (or: through) it)'. This reading not only is in agreement with Ibn Sīnā's general view on self-awareness, but is also confirmed by the last line of the present chapter; "Hence yourself is not asserted by your act" -- in this case Inati has correctly understood that the hi of bihi has to be identified with 'your act'.

(3) In ch. 25 of class 3, it is said that "the irascible power produces harm". But the Arabic text, which has dā'ifa li-l-ḍār, affirms exactly the opposite: 'what pushes away what is harmful. This is what one would expect, since Ibn Sīnā always understands each of the powers of the soul, even the lower ones, as having a positive function.

(4) In ch. 1 of class 4, it is said that nothing can be existent unless it is "specified by a space or a position, such as the body, or by the cause in which it resides, such as the states of the body". One wonders what it means to say that 'something resides in a cause'. The Arabic text has 'bi-sababi mā huwa fīhi', not 'bi-l-sababi mā huwa fīhi', as would be required by Inati's translation. The expression bi-sababi signifies 'because of, on account of', and hence a correct rendering would be 'because of that in which it resides' (compare Goichon's French translation: 'à cause de ce en quoi cela se trouve').

(5) In ch. 2 of class 5 the affirmation (p. 114, l. 1-14) "for this existence is of something like that for which it is permissible not to exist", overlooks the final part of the Arabic affirmation which states: 'lā yamkinu an yakūna illā ba'd al-'adami'. Taking into account this fact, one could reformulate as follows: "for this existence, which is of something like that for which it is permissible not to exist, can only exist after having been non-existent".

(6) In ch. 33, of class 6 (p. 160, l. 27) ma'lūliyya is surprisingly rendered as 'being cause'. However, this is almost certainly a printing error, since on the next line the correct translation, i.e., 'being caused', appears.

(7) In the next chapter, the English translation, in direct contradiction with the Arabic text, affirms that, when the container and the contained are taken together as possible "there will be no void". The absence of a negation in the Arabic text does pose problems, insofar as it seems at odds with Ibn Sīnā's (Aristotelian) conception of place. But, if Inati consciously added the negation, she should have mentioned it in a note.

(8) In ch. 4 of class 7, it is said of the sensitive powers that they neither apprehend their instruments nor the apprehension of their instruments because they "have no other instruments (for apprehending) their instruments and the apprehension of those instruments". Inati tries here to make sense of Dunya's edition, which proposes: '(li-annahā) lā alāt lahā illā ālātuhā wa-idrākātuhā'. But is obvious that illā is a mistaken reading for ilā, as attested in both other Arabic editions, so that the affirmation becomes: '(because they) have no instrument for (apprehending) their instruments and the apprehensions of them'.

I think that these remarks, while non-exhaustive, sufficiently show that the translation poses now and then serious problems, even if it is also at other times very valuable.

[1] A.-M. Goichon, Ibn Sīnā (Avicenne): Livre des directives et des remarques. Beyrout-Paris, 1951.

[2] See my An Annotated Bibliography on Ibn  Sīnā (1970-1989). Leuven, 1991 and An Annotated Bibliography on Ibn  Sīnā. First Supplement (1990-1994). Louvain-la-Neuve, 1999. A second supplement is currently in preparation.

[3] For the previously published parts of her translation, see Shams C. Inati, Ibn Sīnā. Remarks and Admonitions. Part One: Logic. Toronto, Ontario, 1984 and idem, Ibn Sīnā and Mysticism. Remarks and Admonitions. London, 1996.

[4] The three existing editions are: S. Dunyā, published in Cairo 1957-50, 2. Ed. Cairo, 1968-72 (with a somewhat different pagination) (this latter edition is used here by author, in a reprint of part two of 1992 and of part three of 1985); J. Forget’s, published in Leiden, 1892, and M. Zāre’ī’s, published in Qom, 1423 h.q./ 1381 h.sh. (2002/03).

[5] D. Gutas, Avicenna and the Aristotelian Tradition. Leiden, 1988, pp. 140-41 and 307-11, (see now also, 2. Edition. Leiden, 2014, pp. 155-59 and 348-51).

[6] J. Kaukua, "Avicenna on Subjectivity. A Philosophical Study", Jyväskylä, 2007, p. 111.