Ibsen's Hedda Gabler: Philosophical Perspectives

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Kristin Gjesdal (ed.), Ibsen's Hedda Gabler: Philosophical Perspectives, Oxford University Press, 2018, 256pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190467883.

Reviewed by Stein Haugom Olsen, Bilkent University


This collection contains 10 essays plus a substantial introduction by the editor. The essays are newly commissioned and published in the series Oxford Studies in Philosophy and Literature. They are written, the blurb says, by 'leading voices in the fields of drama studies, European philosophy, Scandinavian studies, and comparative literature' and aim to bring out 'the philosophical resonances of Hedda Gabler and lbsen's drama more broadly'.

The promise of 'philosophical perspectives' can be fulfilled in various ways. An essay can, among other things, adopt a philosophically informed perspective on the work in question, or look at the philosophical ideas found in a literary work, or trace influences of a philosopher or a philosophical tradition on a work or an author, or look at the philosophical arguments that a work sets out. The title of Kristin Gjesdal's introduction, 'Philosophizing with Ibsen', seems to indicate that the collection aims to do the last of these. She seems to confirm this when she chooses not to introduce the collection by providing comments on the chapters that bind them together, but rather chooses to 'reflect, more generally, on the reasons for putting together such a volume and, moreover, what I take to be the deep and profound philosophical legacy of lbsen's work' (p. 1). However, what the introduction provides is an account of the place and influence of European (Continental) philosophy on the intellectual culture in Scandinavia in the period when Ibsen wrote his best known plays, what she calls 'golden age in Scandinavian and Norwegian philosophy and art' (p.6). 'In Scandinavian late nineteenth-century culture', Gjesdal insists, 'to be a painter or a poet meant to be able to broker a broader intellectual agenda, one in which philosophical reflection had an obvious role to play' (p. 6).

The account of the cultural background is interesting and convincing, but what Gjesdal fails to do is establish the crucial link between this background and Hedda Gabler. As Ronald Crane pointed out more than fifty years ago, to assume that such cultural trends as one can identify in any one period 'affected all writers or any individual writer at all times' is 'a fundamental confusion in method' (R.S. Crane, The Idea of the Humanities and Other Essays Critical and Historical, Vol. 2, University of Chicago Press, 1967, p. 271). To establish this connection a further argument is needed, and this argument Gjesdal does not provide. The absence of such a clear, documented connection between Ibsen's work and the cultural background is also reflected in central critical terms she uses: Hedda Gabler 'resonates' or 'reverberates' with philosophical ideas. These notions are hardly precise critical instruments.

The majority of the essays choose to approach Hedda Gabler from the perspective of a particular philosopher or philosophical tradition which is then used as a 'prism' for reading the play. Leonardo F. Lisi focuses his discussion of the play through the concept of 'nihilism' and complementary concept like 'authentic meaning' and 'boredom'. Boredom is, of course, an important concept in the play, but when 'nihilism' is used to focus the theme of the play, boredom becomes the central phenomenon. Thomas Stern approaches the play through Leo Löwenthal's defence and Adorno's writings about it. Frode Helland sees 'Hedda Gabler in Adorno's Prism'. Kristin Boyce argues 'that if we attend in the right way to the surprising resonances between Ibsen's play and Plato's [Symposium], we will appreciate more deeply what Ibsen can show us not only about what theater is and what it can be, but also about why we should care' (p. 132). Fred Rush brings the play 'into connection with one of the most trenchant nineteenth-century treatments of the labyrinths of heightened subjectivity, the work of Søren Kierkegaard' (p. 196). And Gjesdal reads 'Hedda Gabler in a Nietzschean Light' (p. 215).

In the absence of concrete, documented connections between Ibsen's work and particular philosophers, particular philosophical works, and/or particular philosophical traditions the project of adopting this type of 'philosophical perspective' becomes problematic, and all of the essays suffer from 'the fundamental confusion in method' that Crane diagnosed. There is also the problem that if one adopts a predefined set of philosophical ideas and reads the play in the light of these, one risks leaving out large parts of the play or closing off avenues of inquiry that it might have been fruitful to explore. Let me give just one example. In the final chapter, Gjesdal uses Nietzsche's typologies of three different kinds of history and historians in developing her view of Løvborg and Tesman, and through her discussion of their role as historians she arrives at 'the point at which we can start getting a fuller sense of a possible dialogue between Nietzsche's philosophy and Ibsen's drama' (p. 232). However, it is quite possible to argue that Løvborg and Tesman should have been set against quite a different background from the one apparently provided by Nietzsche's ideas. In the second half of the 19th century the academic discipline of history developed to a point where there was an unambiguous and clear distinction between the new professional historians who produced their work within a strict disciplinary matrix and the older type of historian whose genre was the grand and interesting narrative, a genre that was not constrained by disciplinary standards and procedures. By 1890 the old breed of historians had lost their intellectual authority as this authority became institutionalised in the university represented by its professional specialists, the professors and researchers. Løvborg and Tesman fit neatly into these two categories. It is not merely that Løvborg is undisciplined in his living; his work is in a literal sense not disciplined. The problem with adopting the 'philosophical perspective' is that this avenue of inquiry is closed off.

For at least one of the essays it can be claimed that the contributor adopts the first perspective mentioned above: a philosophically informed approach to Hedda Gabler. Susan Feagin's 'Where Hedda Dies. The Significance of Place' takes as its point of departure the distinction between 'place' and 'space' developed by Yi-fu Tuan (p.49). She draws on the philosophical debate about various concepts of freedom in her discussion of Hedda's quest for freedom. Her main focus is on 'what is commonly called stage space or theatrical space' (p. 50) and in particular on the space of the back room where Hedda shoots herself. She introduces the concept of 'non-place' from Marc Augé, to characterize the back room, non-places being 'sites where one is typically autonomous and "alone", even when surrounded by other people', sites that 'lack the traditional network of obligations and responsibilities that places have as sites where one interacts with others' (pp.63-64). Throughout the play, Feagin argues, Hedda employs a number of strategies to dissociate herself both 'from others and from the real context of action', rejecting all responsibility and obligations in order to achieve freedom. She wants to be free 'from both outside coercion and internal compulsion' (p. 64). However, though the back room functions as a non-place, it cannot provide Hedda with a space where she can achieve the freedom she wants. For there is no such thing as a 'pure' non-place. All non-places are nodes in a network of at least some kinds of obligations and responsibilities, as is demonstrated by the interaction between Hedda in the backroom and the others in the reception room, even when the curtain is drawn. So when Hedda commits suicide in the backroom, her death reflects 'the vacuity of her quest to be free in the sense of being free from obligations or responsibilities' (pp. 69-70). The philosophical perspective is here put to good use to illuminate the play and enhances one's appreciation of what takes place on the stage.

One of the main stumbling blocks for an audience or a readership with little or no Norwegian is that important linguistic nuances in Ibsen's works tend to get lost even in the best translations. A case in point is the translation of Fruen fra Havet as The Lady from the Sea, which loses the whole point of the title. In Hedda Gabler the translation of Assessor Brack as Judge Brack loses the 'bysitter' motif which is so powerful in the play. In chapter 7 ('Hedda's Words. The Work of Language in Hedda Gabler) Toril Moi does deal with the language of Hedda. She claims that her essay 'is inspired by ordinary language philosophy', but it cannot really be said to adopt a philosophically informed approach to the play. Reading the essay, one is back in the world of practical criticism and close reading with its emphasis on teasing out linguistic nuances and how they contribute to the artistic vision of the play. And this Moi does very well. She brings deep knowledge of Ibsen and Ibsen's language to bear on the verbal exchanges of which the play has so many, and where a proper understanding of the finer nuances of the Norwegian language is important. A good example is her analysis of the words used in the conversation between Hedda and Løvborg when Hedda is pretending to show him pictures from her honeymoon. Central words in this conversation are 'omsvøbsfuldt and frejdig, which Arup translates as "roundabout" and "confidently:" Etymologically, omsvøb is connected to the action of making a detour, as well as to the action of veiling, wrapping, or covering something. The Dictionary of the Danish Language (ODS) stresses that the word is used to signal a "conscious veiling of meaning or intentions, or unwillingness to speak straightforwardly"' (p.165). Moi then points out that the translation actually 'loses the reference to a svøb -- a piece of cloth used to wrap something in (a burial cloth is a ligsvøb)'. She then goes on to point out how inadequate 'confident' is as a translation of frejdig and uses a long paragraph to tease out the meaning of this word in Norwegian. This is first class close reading and there is quite a lot of it in Moi's essay, but there is more here to remind one of Empson than of J. L. Austin or Wittgenstein.

Two of the essays do not really bother with the philosophical perspectives. Kirsten E. Shepherd-Barr ('Against Interpretation? Hedda and the Performing Self') sharply focuses on what one can learn from particular performances of the play. She argues that Hedda is Ibsen's strongest representation of the idea that 'as a woman, you are always performing a role: acting in an environment not created with you in mind and following a script someone else has written' (p. 176). She pursues her argument through an analysis of Elizabeth Robbins 1891 performance of Hedda Gabler with its strong elements of melodrama that permits the actress playing Hedda to make full use of her body, facial expression, and gestures to give expression to an inner self that does not come out in the dialog of the play. When Edmund Gosse and other nineteenth century critics of the play complained about the 'truncated, inarticulate, and unremarkable dialogue' (p. 180), they failed to see that this offered the actress playing Hedda 'a golden opportunity to exploit . . . 'the play's dislocation between reality and language' (p. 180). Shepherd-Barr brings out the dramatic possibilities of what Toril Moi elsewhere has called Hedda's silences and illuminates the play in a way that the essays using a type of philosophy of a philosopher as a 'prism' fail to do.

Then there is Arnold Weinstein's "My Life had stood, a Loaded Gun". Agency and Writing in Hedda Gabler'). Weistein takes as his point of departure the poem by Emily Dickinson referred to in the title of his essay and argues that Hedda herself is this loaded gun just waiting to go off. There is no connection between Dickinson's poem and Hedda Gabler. However, though Ibsen 'could not have heard of Emily Dickinson, he not only understood her plight, but explored it as a revolutionary neural and performative proposition, keyed to the very energies of theater, rupturing every code it comes up against: behavioral, psychological, social' (p.113). One is tempted here to quote a famous line from Peer Gynt, a play Weinstein himself makes use of, to characterize his essay: '[M]en pytt; hvor Udgangspunktet er galest,/​blir tidt Resultatet originalest, (Act IV, HIS 647) ('[B]ut pooh; the wilder the starting-point, the result will oft be the more original' (Archer)).

Weistein's essay is indeed original, but it is more Arnold Weinstein apropos of Hedda Gabler, than Henrik Ibsen's Hedda Gabler. Weinstein rightly observes that 'When the curtain goes down, the rebels and narcissists are offed; life goes on; the helpers carry the day' (p.115), but this does not satisfy him: 'Yet no spectator or reader ever feels that this noble spectacle of nurturance, whatever its moral excellences may be, takes the measure of the play'. And then the clichés of Ibsen criticism kick in, though expressed in a somewhat stronger and more colourful vocabulary than usual. The domestic scenes of the play show 'massive carceral arrangements of . . . oppressiveness and paralysis' and this sets the scene for the gun that is to go off. Hedda is 'the freedom-fighter' who blows up 'the cultural prisons of her moment'. This is Ibsen fulfilling his promise to 'torpedo the Ark' (p. 115).

 The problem with Weinstein's essay is that he takes what is marginal and makes it central and central elements that do not fit into his thesis are not considered. The line 'I'll gladly, myself, torpedo the Ark' comes from an occasional poem written in 1869 to the Swedish politician Alfred Hedin, who had remarked to Ibsen that he had become conservative. Weinstein gives this occasional poem written to Hedin prominence while other much more central elements in Ibsen's work of importance for an insight into Ibsen's attitude to the values of the 'helpers', e.g Terje Vigen and the last scene of Peer Gynt, are ignored.

Weinstein's essay is clever and well written and this is a quality it shares with the other essays in this collection. However, cleverness is not quite enough to produce illuminating and memorable criticism, nor is the 'philosophical perspective' helpful. Some of the essays are genuinely illuminating for a reader of Hedda Gabler, but this is not due to the 'philosophical perspective'.