Iconoclasm and Aesthetics

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Kelly, Michael, Iconoclasm and Aesthetics, Cambridge, 2003, 204pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521822092.

Reviewed by J.M. Bernstein , New School for Social Research


If the heartbeat of philosophy is the separation of appearance from reality, and if the lifeblood of art is interrogation of the world of appearances, then will not philosophy almost inevitably approach art with the severest mistrust - either denying the legitimacy of art's adherence to mere appearings or, turning art against itself, showing that the appearances point to a reality separate from themselves after all? Can philosophy acknowledge the claims of art without denying itself? Can art tolerate philosophical comprehension without becoming so tortured out of ontological shape that it stops being itself? Are not philosophy's repudiations of art (the long arm of the great Platonic expulsion of the poets) and its appropriations of art as a deferred giver of truth (the Aristotelian saving gesture) both ways of denying of art, of destroying art as art? Can philosophy be other than iconoclastic when it comes to art?

In this crisply argued and probing monograph, Michael Kelly contends that iconoclasm - understood as a "combination of disinterest and distrust in art that stems from a tendency to inscribe a deficiency into the very conception (or ontology) of art" (xi) - is a pervasive effect of the way in which even philosophers apparently sympathetic to art conceptualize it. Hence, the way in which Heidegger, Adorno, Derrida, and Danto are interested in art turns into a systematic and corrosive disinterest. More precisely, the philosophical interest in the universality of art - interest in its truth or essence or meaning or transcendental conditioning or definition - becomes for these philosophers constitutive of art, overwhelming other considerations and leading them to abstract art from its historical condition. But insofar as art is conditioned by its historical particularity, then to abstract art from those conditions is equivalent to disinterest in art. Iconoclasm, then, is the upshot of a systematic dehistoricizing of art in the name of a putative universality the philosopher brings to his encounter with art.

In prosecuting this thesis, Kelly pointedly triangulates each philosopher with both an artist and an art critic or historian in order to demonstrate exactly how a philosophical interest can reveal itself, in a concrete and specific instance, as disinterest, which can thus stand for the iconoclasm of that position generally. Heidegger's account of van Gogh's painting of the peasant woman's shoes in "On the Origin of the Work of Art" thus is paired with Meyer Schapiro's well-known critique that the shoes - if the painting is the one Schapiro thinks it must be but which Heidegger does not even bother to identify - almost certainly were van Gogh's own, and that even if they were not, in the light of his practice generally, the painting must still be thought to be a self-portrait. More tendentiously, Kelly construes Benjamin Buchloh's famous 1986 interview with Gerhard Richter as a dialogue between an Adornoian theorist and a skeptical practitioner, with Richter parrying each of Buchloh's extreme analyses of his paintings (as end-of-art anti-paintings) with quiet demurs and denials. Derrida's theory of art, as it appears in The Truth in Painting and the catalogue for his curated show Memoirs of the Blind, the Self-Portrait and Other Ruins, is paired with the highly allegorical paintings of Mark Tansey, especially a (1990) and White on White (1986), both in themselves and as they are interpreted by Arthur Danto (here playing the role of art historian). Finally, Danto's own philosophy of art is set into motion as his analyses of the work of Cindy Sherman (the Untitled Film Stills as mythic representations of "The Girl" in her myriad embodiments) are contrasted with those of the art historian Rosalind Krauss, who contends that Sherman's deployments of the photographic means of representation are for the sake of fragmenting and displacing mythic meanings.

Kelly's espousal of the claims of the history of art, including art's own continual implicit reflective self-comprehension, is a welcome, pointed and procedurally apt response to his diagnosis of iconoclasm - there can be no doubt that more attention to concrete cases is a step toward a more self-aware philosophy of art. Nonetheless, in detail, as Kelly is aware, the reference to art history is not unequivocal: both Schapiro (on van Gogh) and Krauss (on Sherman) are not just art historians, but possess weighty art theories of their own, which while certainly more attuned to historical specificity (than Heidegger) and the material elements of the photographic image (than Danto), carry what might be regarded as their own iconoclastic baggage. Does sheer responsiveness to and interest in art historical detail necessarily provide insurance against iconoclasm? Buchloh's ascription of a systematically negative practice of painting to Richter cannot easily be aligned with the Adorno of Aesthetic Theory since there, as everywhere, negation dialectically turns into affirmation, art's materialist promise of happiness. And Mark Tansey's response in painting to the claims of deconstruction critique a vulgar conception of it, without really touching on its larger claims. But the point needs generalizing: the implicit reflection on the meaning of art in any given art work or series of works by any artist can be as historically insensitive or dogmatic or misguided as the iconoclastic pronouncements of any philosopher; e.g., I understand why Frank Stella became the exorbitant painter he did, how his late paintings take a stand against the purism of high modernist theory inspired by Clement Greenberg, but they are still grandly vulgar paintings that do nothing to renew painting or respond to the deadlock of late modernism. Painting can err, and err reflectively, just as crudely as theory.

These quibbles over his use of art history aside, one may regard Kelly's argument about philosophy's iconoclasm as a refinement and extension of Danto's idea that every encounter between art and philosophy becomes a philosophical disenfranchisement of art, and that indeed historically philosophy has assured itself of its authority through its dissolution of the authority of art. I strongly suspect that some version of the Danto/Kelly theory must be right; in extending it to philosophers who, arguably, constructed their theories as a response to the traditional philosophical repudiation of art, Kelly means to be instructing us on the sheer difficulty of the encounter, and on the iconoclastic shatterings that can lurk in even the most art-empathic of theories. Even though I suppose that Kelly must be right about all this, the actual prosecution of the argument raised a recurrent issue. As Kelly repeatedly contends, the mechanism through which philosophical universalism comes to trump artistic particularity is the ascription to the artwork of a deficiency in some deep respect. So significant does Kelly think this feature of the argument, that in propounding his own conception of aesthetics in the final chapter he seeks to underline art's "abilities and strengths, even relative to philosophy, rather than its inabilities and weaknesses …

I am emphasizing art's potency rather than its deficiency" (188-9). Now it is just here where I sense insensitivity to the projects of his different authors. Roughly and crudely, this group of philosophers turns to art precisely because it represents something that is constitutively deficient, that is, finite, sensuous, material, non-self-sufficient, ephemeral, opaque, mortal, indeterminate. Where Kelly sees the inscription of a deficiency to be overcome, I see the deficiency itself as the attraction, as what is to be affirmed: art stands for precisely what traditionally and dominantly philosophy has sought to repudiate, and hence the transformation of philosophy can best occur by the theoretical appreciation of art and the assimilation, as appropriate, of philosophy to art. Something like this thought is there for the asking in Heidegger, Adorno, and Derrida, if not Danto, whose love of art is, in this respect, purer and more direct, less philosophically interested, and his philosophical biases consequently more traditional.

Because Kelly does not fully grant the claim of deficiency, the claim of finitude being made through art, his critiques - even where appropriate - are launched prematurely. In Chapter One, he nicely shows how when Heidegger turns to van Gogh's painting he in fact describes not the depiction of the shoes in the painting, but simply the shoes themselves - which certainly does look like a disinterest in painting. But this disinterest, Kelly contends, is really a philosophically demanded disinterest since Heidegger's real question is 'What is truth itself such that it sometimes comes to pass as art?' rather than 'What is art such that (sometimes) truth discloses itself in it?' This accurately states Heidegger's priority, but does not sufficiently capture the meaning of his turn to art. At the center of Heidegger's philosophy of art is the claim that works set up a world that comes forth from and sets forth the earth. The concept of earth in Heidegger corresponds to artworks being embodiments of meanings and thus bound to the constraints of a medium; hence the concept of earth means to give unconditional legitimacy to what is arguably an utterly central feature of artworks. But the notion of earth in Heidegger operates as a principle of transcendental opacity, as what conspires to make truth itself finite rather than infinite, and hence as a limit to the claims of disembodied reason and the dreams of technology. Karsten Harries plausibly claims that "the presentation of the earth requires art, and because it does, Heidegger's postmetaphysical thinking does not lead to a philosophy of art but seeks to enter into dialogue with artists and poets …" What goes along with this thesis is the claim that the kind of art which can provide world-disclosure, "great art," is not now extant; there is art now, but not great art. If these really are the theoretical linchpins of Heidegger's art doctrine, then a claim of iconoclasm must confront them in particular. Isn't the notion of the earth an attempt to insure art and philosophy against iconoclasm?

Kelly's indictment of Adorno is relentless: "art is not only a lie, it is also insufficient [to realize what it promises, and to communicate its own truth content], and now powerless [compared to the potencies of empirical experience] - all relative to the truth Adorno wants to establish as art's content … [I]conoclasm is the effect of his concept of art [not its intention]" (74). Iconoclasm could be the effect of this account of art's deficiencies - its semblance character, its poverty and impotence - were they necessary attributes of artworks; but for Adorno at least some of art's deficiencies are local, that is, products only of the modern, autonomous work of art. And the modern autonomous work of art has these features because the fundamental claim which each and every authentic artwork lodges for what is irreducibly sensuously particular (where sensuous particularity plays the role in Adorno's thought that the earth does in Heidegger's) is in defense of what has been expelled from the precincts of enlightened rationality and capital/technology/rationalized society. But once this is acknowledged, then it is utterly unclear why disinterest and distrust would follow from the characterization of works as semblances. Is not the point of the analysis to explicate why we should care and care terribly about objects that have precisely the deficiencies noted? And does it not matter that deficiency in Adorno translates into lack of self-sufficiency, where what might correct this deficiency, say philosophical criticism, is itself characterized as partial, biased, and not self-sufficient? For Adorno philosophy and art stand respectively for a reified universality and a blinded sensuous particularity that have become reified and blinded because of their separation; hence philosophy's abstractions require the corrections of art's concretions, whilst the artwork's blindness requires the refinements of conceptual reflection. This mutual dependency of philosophy and art - an abbreviated, conceptual version of the master/slave dialectic - is meant to explain our caring about art in the way we do; and because it so explains our caring, then the understanding of art is necessarily bound to this quite philosophical conception of truth. I see neither disinterest nor distrust as flowing from art's truth content - that it is the delegitimated slave of the master concept; truth content, rather, gives rational credence to our otherwise dogmatic allegiances.

An analogous slippage occurs in Kelly's handling of Derrida. Kelly states his critique of Derrida thus: "The illusory nature of art is not that it seems to capture something realistically (say, van Gogh's shoes), but that it appears to represent something when, in fact, it does not represent anything at all (at least not with any determinacy). When revealed as such, this false appearance leads us to distrust art and this distrust is, along with the disinterest Derrida has already proudly displayed, what generates iconoclasm" (108). Now it is perfectly true that Derrida argues against both Heidegger and Schapiro that van Gogh's picture does not determinately mean what either of them suppose it to mean because, he contends, no authentic (modernist? avant-garde?) work means in that way. In league with Adorno and Heidegger, Derrida wants to claim that works of art essentially exceed their discursive articulation; hence, we best understand the power of van Gogh's shoes when we see how the painting both invites and exceeds the discourses (Heidegger's, Schapiro's, Derrida's own) surrounding it. In part this is a metaphysical thesis: all determinate meaning depends on an indeterminate ground that can never be determinately represented; and in part this is a benign thesis about the kind of meaning works of art possess: works of art mean the way metaphors mean and not the way algebraic equations mean. Like a good metaphor, a work of art is productive of meanings that cannot be fully systematized or regimented; but that fact - a metaphor's lack of determinacy - is part of its goodness, and not a deficiency that should lead to distrust. Because Derrida thinks that metaphorical meaning precedes literal meaning, his strong metaphysical thesis naturally coheres with his otherwise conventional understanding of metaphorical meaning. There is no reason to suppose that lack of determinate meaning entails lack of meaning as such.

Ironically, Danto falls outside this pattern despite the fact that his conception of the philosophical disenfranchisement of art is the conceptual origin of Kelly's concept of iconoclasm. So despite the fact that Danto thinks that essentially artworks are forms of embodied meaning, where the notion of embodiment has some of the sense that weight and density as earth, sensuous particularity, and indeterminacy have for the other three philosophers, his philosophical interest is in producing a traditional essentialist definition that holds true of all works of art irrespective of time or place. The corollary of such an essentialist definition is that, as Danto concedes, he drops from consideration what makes art absorbing, entrancing, important - which is a disinterest of a high kind: the very act of comprehending something makes its worth, value, and meaning disappear. This does strike me as iconoclasm. It should also make us more sympathetic to philosophies that focus on a particular range of artworks - great art (Heidegger), high modernist art (Adorno), avant-garde art (Derrida) - in order to elucidate how and why art matters or fails to matter when and where it does.

There are obvious ways in which Heidegger's, Adorno's, and Derrida's accounts of art converge (over finitude, opacity, the limits of discursivity, etc.), nonetheless they are very different philosophical theories. In insisting against Kelly that central to each is a prima facie anti-iconoclasm thesis, I do not mean to suggest that each thesis is true, or deny that with further probing an iconoclasm of just the sort that Kelly urges will be shown to be present. The more modest thought is just that until we have accurately in place the depth of each of their critiques of iconoclasm, their sense of why art matters, and hence why a discourse of poverty, indigence, deficiency, opacity and the like may be utterly appropriate to appreciating the claims of art, and hence that philosophy's interest in art may rightfully be an interest in art's deficiencies, until all that is sorted we cannot accurately or confidently distinguish between a philosophical appreciation of art and a philosophical repudiation of art.