Idea and Ontology: An Essay in Early Modern Metaphysics of Ideas

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Marc A. Hight, Idea and Ontology: An Essay in Early Modern Metaphysics of Ideas, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2008, 278pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271033839.

Reviewed by Monte Cook, University of Oklahoma


The title of Marc A. Hight's book might suggest that it is appropriate for someone seeking an introductory overview of the key notion of idea as it appears in early (i.e., pre-Kantian) modern philosophy. The book does indeed cover the theories of ideas of a wide range of modern philosophers, devoting individual chapters to Descartes, Malebranche and Arnauld, Locke, Leibniz, and Hume, and three chapters to Berkeley (40% of the book is on Berkeley). Nevertheless, the book's extensive engagement with problems of interpretation and with the secondary literature would make it difficult reading for someone who does not specialize in modern philosophy.

Hight criticizes what he takes to be a common picture (the dust jacket refers to it as "the prevailing view") of the development in early modern philosophy of the metaphysics of ideas. According to this picture, which he calls "the early modern tale," the new theories of ideas taking off from Descartes, so promising in epistemology, led to a collapse of ontology. Though the first of the moderns -- Descartes, Malebranche, and Arnauld -- each fit their theories of ideas into a traditional ontology according to which everything was either a substance or a mode, there was a tension between their theories and the traditional ontology. And this tension, the picture has it, led Locke, Berkeley, and Hume to deny that ideas had any ontological status.

Hight believes that this "tale" fails to do justice to the texts and underestimates the philosophical sophistication of the early moderns. Abandoning it, he argues, not only is warranted by the texts but also pays off with significant insights. Once we abandon the early modern tale, we can see, for example, how Berkeley's much maligned theory of divine ideas is actually philosophically respectable, how his attack on abstract ideas makes sense, and why Berkeley held the unusual view that we do not see and touch numerically the same objects. Hight agrees that the new theories of ideas were in tension with the traditional substance/mode ontology, but he seeks to show that the moderns never abandoned trying to fit ideas into such an ontology. Thus, though Locke played down questions of ontology, he operated within a substance/mode ontology and had an implicit ontology of ideas. And though Berkeley took ideas to be what Hight calls "quasi substances," which have characteristics of both substances and modes, he still operated within a substance/mode ontology. Finally, though in reasoning about ideas Hume resisted making ideas quasi-substances, he too operated within a substance/mode ontology.

Two obvious questions are what tension is there between the new theories of ideas and a substance/mode ontology and who is supposed to subscribe to the early modern tale. Since Hight wants mainly to attack the early modern tale and agrees with the tale that there is a tension between the theories of ideas and a substance/mode ontology, he says relatively little about this supposed tension. He takes the controversy between Malebranche and Arnauld over the nature of ideas to show there is one. For Hight this is an ontological controversy about whether ideas are substances (Malebranche) or modes (Arnauld):

Neither Arnauld nor Malebranche … denies the important epistemological role of ideas. What they quarreled about was whether such functions were carried out by ideas construed as modes or as substances. (95)

And he takes this controversy, rather than having a winner, to result in encouraging philosophers to work elsewhere:

Descartes' philosophy of ideas left unresolved the issue of how ideas were to be reconciled with the traditional ontology of substance and mode. A debate ensued, epitomized most famously by the Malebranche-Arnauld exchanges, but little apparent progress was made. As a result, some turned their attention away from questions of ontology altogether. (79)

But was the controversy between Malebranche and Arnauld a controversy about whether ideas were substances or modes? Perhaps so, but this is not how either Malebranche or Arnauld kept describing it. For Malebranche, the basic disagreement was whether ideas were modifications of the mind: for Arnauld they were; for Malebranche they were not. For Arnauld, the basic disagreement was whether ideas were distinct from perceptions: for Malebranche they were; for Arnauld they were not. Neither characterized the disagreement as being over whether ideas were substances or modes; and indeed, though Malebranche was clear that ideas were not modifications of the mind, he left it rather fuzzy whether ideas were substances. Also, did philosophers in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries regard the controversy between Malebranche and Arnauld as indecisive, so that -- as the early modern tale has it -- they might give up hope of fitting ideas into a substance/mode ontology? Again perhaps so, but one would like further evidence that this is historically accurate.

Hight discusses various philosophers who subscribe to some aspect of the early modern tale, but the two central figures are John Yolton and Richard Watson. He tells us that according to Watson "several early moderns rejected the notion that ideas have any ontic status at all" (28). And he quotes supporting passages from their works:

Locke did not consider ideas to have an ontological status (3, citing page 94 of Yolton's Perceptual Acquaintance from Descartes to Reid, Hight's emphasis);

Hume … breaks entirely with the ontological structure of substance and modification (246, citing pages 127-28 of Watson's The Breakdown of Cartesian Metaphysics).

One wishes that Hight had explained more fully why Yolton and Watson accept the early modern tale. In fact, he sometimes writes as though he cannot understand this himself. Thus, after saying that according to Yolton "Locke's quiet contribution to the way of ideas … was to remove them not just from the traditional ontology but from ontology altogether," he says that "when we turn to examine what Locke actually says about the nature of ideas, it is difficult to understand what grounds Yolton's thinking" (81-82). But we would like to know what the early modern tale has in its favor -- surely Yolton and Watson saw something, even if they mischaracterized it.

Lacking a clear sense of why Yolton and Watson subscribe to the early modern tale and being struck by how strong Hight's arguments are, one might naturally wonder whether they actually do subscribe to it. We have seen that Yolton explicitly says that Locke did not consider ideas to have an ontological status. But what could Yolton mean by this? As Hight notes (3), it is hard to understand what it might mean for a philosopher who has a theory of ideas to deny that ideas have an ontological status. (No wonder Hight says that "trying to deny that ideas have an ontic status … is both conceptually confusing and simply mistaken" -- 27.) And how can Yolton say that ideas have no ontological status and at the same time continually assimilate Locke to Arnauld, who treats ideas as having the ontological status of modifications of the mind? Faced with such questions, we should suspect that Yolton does not really mean to say that for Locke ideas have no ontological status at all; rather, we should suspect that he means to say that for Locke they have no ontological status distinct from our perceptions -- that Locke is rejecting a Malebranchean account of ideas. As Hight notes, in "Ideas and Knowledge in Seventeenth-Century Philosophy," Yolton does have a section titled "LOCKE: IDEAS DE-ONTOLOGIZED," and he does say that for Locke ideas are "not real entities." But this is part of a discussion of Locke's rejection of a Malebranchean view of ideas. For Hight, the controversy between Malebranche and Arnauld ends inconclusively. But for Locke, at least as Yolton understands him, the controversy between Malebranche and Arnauld does not end inconclusively: Arnauld clearly wins. Like Arnauld, Locke is supposed to reject ideas as "real entities" and to have de-ontologized ideas in the sense of denying that there were "special entities standing between knower and known."[1]

Since Hight is arguing for a broad thesis about early modern philosophy, and consequently covering a lot of ground, it is to be expected that he would fail to cover certain issues and certain literature that might seem relevant. In discussing the nature of substance, for example, he obliquely touches on the question whether Descartes believes that there are many corporeal substances or only one, or perhaps believes neither of these because he takes "material substance" to be a mass term and not a count noun at all (16-17); but Hight does not go into the recent literature discussing this question. And he speaks of Descartes's being led to an odd form of occasionalism (54), but he does not address any of the recent literature discussing whether Descartes is an occasionalist of some sort. Still, he covers a considerable amount of secondary literature. Modern specialists will find interesting his criticisms of Thomas Lennon's interpretation of Locke on ideas (88-94), of George Pitcher's adverbial analysis of Berkeley's ideas (148-55), of Kenneth Winkler's phenomenalist reading of Berkeley (161-65 and continuing), and of Robert Muehlmann's argument for the privacy of Berkeley's sensory ideas (193-202) -- to mention just a few of Hight's many discussions of the secondary literature.

It should be clear that Berkeley is the key figure of this study. According to the early modern tale, Descartes, Malebranche, and Arnauld are just steps on the way to the breakdown of ontology for ideas, revealing a tension between the theory of ideas and traditional ontology, which tension is supposed to lead to the breakdown. With Locke we see the beginning of the breakdown, and with Hume we see the continued development of the breakdown; but the breakdown is supposed already to be complete in Berkeley: "the famous immaterialist George Berkeley is the key to the early modern tale… . once Berkeley is folded into the tale the story is essentially complete" (4). And if we go by Hight's emphasis, it seems that the early modern tale does particular damage to our understanding of Berkeley. Thus Hight begins his discussion of Berkeley by saying,

I … defend the claim that reading the early moderns through the lens of the traditional substance/mode distinction yields interpretive and philosophical insights hidden by the early modern tale. So in subsequent chapters I engage several important issues in Berkeley scholarship within the framework of my reading of Berkeley's theory of ideas … (139)

Finally, one other theme in the book should be mentioned. Throughout sHight suggests that the early modern tale mistakenly takes the moderns to abandon ontology for epistemology. According to the tale, the concept of an idea is supposed to have proved fruitful for epistemology, but, as the moderns became increasingly aware, ideas could not be fit into the traditional ontological categories of substance and mode. This is supposed to have gradually led the moderns "to abandon ontology altogether with respect to ideas" (3). Of course, there are different ways in which one could abandon ontology. One might abandon doing ontology because it was too hard or because it was not fruitful. This is not Hight's understanding of the early modern tale. He is willing himself to say, for example, that Locke basically abandoned explicitly doing ontology (see 79). One might also abandon ontology in the sense of abandoning a specific ontology, in the case at hand a substance/mode ontology. This is part of what Hight has in mind when he speaks of the early modern tale. And it makes sense to think that the early moderns had epistemological reasons for accepting the existence of entities that did not fit well within such an ontology. Here Hight's general point is that, for all the difficulties, a substance/mode ontology was at a minimum operating in the background for philosophers like Locke, Berkeley, and Hume. Finally, one might abandon ontology in the sense of denying that ideas have any ontological status. Hight clearly does have this view in mind as being part of the early modern tale. It is unclear, however, how epistemological considerations would lead one to deny that ideas have any ontological status. Hight says that he finds it "odd that neither Watson nor Yolton consider an obvious alternative. If the traditional ontology is demonstrably inadequate, why not generate a new ontology?" (30). And he is surely correct that it does not follow from ideas failing to fit nicely into a substance/mode ontology that ideas have no ontological status at all. But once again one wonders why Watson and Yolton would think otherwise, and charity leads one to wonder whether they actually do deny that ideas have ontological status.

[1] John Yolton, "Ideas and Knowledge in Seventeenth-Century Philosophy," Journal of the History of Philosophy (1975), 153. See also 158-61.