Ideal Code, Real World

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Hooker, Brad, Ideal Code, Real World, Oxford University Press, 2000, 232pp, $35.00 (hbk), 0-19-825069-X.

Reviewed by Julia Driver, Dartmouth College


Anyone interested in contemporary ethical theory should read Brad Hooker’s Ideal Code, Real World. Anyone who believes that rule-consequentialism is finished, as a viable consequentialist alternative certainly should read it. Hooker has developed a distinctive alternative – and one that manages to avoid some of the problems that have plagued earlier versions of the theory.

His version can be stated as follows:

RULE-CONSEQUENTIALISM. An act is wrong if and only if it is forbidden by the code of rules whose internalization by the overwhelming majority of everyone everywhere in each new generation has maximum expected value in terms of well-being (with some priority for the worst off). The calculation of a code’s expected value includes all costs of getting the code internalized. If in terms of expected value two or more codes are better than the rest but equal to one another, the one closest to conventional morality determines what acts are wrong. (p. 32)

This is also supposed to take into consideration the cognitive and affective limitations of the persons internalizing the code, and requires rules “…whose publicity would have good consequences….” and “…whose internalization would be cost-effective.” (p. 32) The account of well-being that Hooker favors is a version of the objective-list theory.

The reason why his theory is consequentialist instead of utilitarian is that it is distribution-sensitive. That is, it is not strictly impartial with respect to distribution issues, as it favors the least well off. Thus, Hooker advocates a view on which there is some priority for the worst off. He reaches this conclusion hesitantly, since it does mean that the theory moves away from strict impartiality. This hesitancy marks Hooker’s commitment to developing a theory that conforms to our considered moral beliefs.

The theory is supposed to help solve the standard problems for act utilitarianism or act-consequentialism—for example, the problem of potential conflicts with justice, which can be solved by appeal to rules of justice, and the demandingness problem, which has a slightly more complicated solution. It also is supposed to help him avoid problems associated with rule-consequentialism as an alternative to act-consequentialism, particularly the problem of the theory collapsing into act-consequentialism. This is quite a famous criticism of rule-consequentialism – that it is either too rigid or absolute and suffers from the same problems as Kantian ethics, or it is so flexible that it might as well be act-utilitarianism. The way this problem is avoided is to build in internalization of the rules. Thus, it is implausible that the optimal system would collapse into “Maximize the Good” because internalization of this as a decision-procedure would be disastrous:

…if we had just the one rule ‘Maximize the good’, sooner or later awareness of this would become widespread. And becoming aware of this would undermine people’s ability to rely confidently on others to behave in agreed upon ways. Trust would break down. In short, terrible consequences would result from the public expectation that this rule would prescribe killing, stealing, and so on when such acts would maximize the good. (p. 94)

For this, and other reasons, rule-consequentialists would not view ‘maximize the good’ as a viable code on its own. A similar point is made to deal with the collapse objection that takes the form of noting that the best rules are so specific that rule-consequentialism collapses into act-consequentialism. “How much confidence would you have in others if you knew they accepted such highly qualified rules?” (p. 96) To avoid the other horn of the dilemma – that the account is thereby too rigid – he notes that on his system there will be a ‘prevent disaster’ rule as well – so one will not be obliged to tell the murderer where his intended victim is, just to avoid telling a lie.

My qualm about this has to do with how well it coheres with Hooker’s solution to another standard problem – the demandingness problem. He views his theory as not overly demanding, unlike standard act-utilitarianism. First of all he notes that demanding moral codes would have high internalization costs, and that counts against them on his view. Further, on his theory there would be room for special obligations and partial relationships, which are crucial to a good life. Thus, we needn’t sacrifice enormous amounts when others are failing to do their share. Thus, the rule he favors with regard to this sort of sacrifice is: “Agents are required to help those in greater need, especially the worst off, even if the personal sacrifices involved in helping others add up to a significant cost to the agents over the course of their lives.” (p. 174) Thus, while Hooker does endorse a fairly demanding rule – one that goes beyond what most people are prepared to do, it is not as demanding as act-utilitarianism which is portrayed as being committed to a level of sacrifice that may well go beyond mere ‘significant’ cost. How well this coheres with the ‘prevent disaster’ rule depends on what means by ‘disaster’. However, the world is filled with putative cases of disasters that could be alleviated by sacrifice – so, consider that Molly could prevent hundreds of children from going blind by donating her entire fortune to Oxfam. What ought she do? Hooker’s favored qualification to ‘prevent disaster’ is:

Over time agents should help those in greater need, especially the worst off, even if the personal sacrifices involved in helping them add up to a significant cost to the agents. The cost to the agents is to be assessed aggregately, not iteratively. (166)

He acknowledges that what is to count as a significant aggregative cost is vague, but that the threshold set “…is not so high that it would require agents to forgo any other personal projects or deep personal relationships.” (167) A more demanding rule has internalization costs that are too high. Thus, it appears as though Molly can keep her money. This has the advantage of according with common-sense intuitions that we needn’t give up things that are important to us in order to help out others; but does it accord with considered intuitions which seem to also hold that at least sometimes personal projects ought to be sacrificed for the greater good? Hooker’s escape clause is rather wide. However, he would not be bothered by this since one of his aims is to develop a version of rule-consequentialism that accords well with intuition. Still, the act-consequentialist can avoid those demanding implications too, by the simple expedient of eschewing a commitment to maximization.

I am very impressed with Hooker’s inventiveness in showing how his version constitutes an improvement over the standard rule-utilitarianism. I do believe, however, that the act-consequentialist may have some disagreement with Hooker over how well his theory offers an improvement over act-consequentialism.

Act-consequentialists need not, for example, eschew the use of rules. It is simply the case that for them, the rules will be rules of thumb rather than absolute rules. Hooker wouldn’t dispute this – I only bring it up to show that the act-consequentialist has some room for maneuvering on the issue of the usefulness of rules – rules of thumb are efficient, and if regarded as rules of thumb, don’t get one into problems of inflexibility. Hooker’s disaster exception rule is a rule intended to build in the same sort of flexibility to his theory.

An act-consequentialist, particularly of the indirect or objective variety, will also note that his or her theory is advocating a mode of evaluation rather than a decision-procedure—and the rules-of-thumb point makes this more salient. Again, Hooker would not disagree. But it really does help to eliminate some of the sting behind some of the criticisms of act-consequentialism if the act-consequentialist can simply say that when it comes to the decision procedure issue, things like rules of thumb work very well. But in evaluating acts we go by the master rule “Maximize the Good.”

His version is presented as less demanding than act-consequentialism, to some extent because it leaves room for partial attachments, as mentioned above. However, again, the sophisticated consequentialist, such as Peter Railton, can present a very similar argument. Frank Jackson’s work on the near and dear also offers a good way to account for partial attachments within an act-consequentialist framework.

So, what is the real difference between the two? I don’t believe that Hooker’s rule- consequentialism is superior in terms of its ability to avoid various theoretical difficulties than, say, a sophisticated version of act-consequentialism. However, it is the best version of rule-consequentialism going. Further, it will appeal to people who believe that act-consequentialism falls short with respect to a really crucial intuition – that some things are just wrong, wrong, wrong. True, the act-consequentialist can argue that our intuitions are shaped by normal circumstances, and in normal circumstances actions of that type (e.g. standard cases of injustice) are wrong, but, again, to many this explanation doesn’t seem satisfying. For those who find this intuition very compelling, Hooker’s theory offers an attractive alternative.

Brad Hooker’s book is excellent. It offers a novel theory. It does so while exhibiting an impressive command of the literature, which allows him to cleanly differentiate his views from the views of others. It is well-argued and fun to read. I highly recommend it to my colleagues. I also think that it would be a very good book to use in an upper-division ethical theory course, or a graduate course on ethical theory.