Idealism and Existentialism: Hegel and Nineteenth- and Twentieth-Century European Philosophy

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Jon Stewart, Idealism and Existentialism: Hegel and Nineteenth- and Twentieth-Century European Philosophy, Continuum, 2010, 282pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441133991.

Reviewed by Andrew LaZella, The University of Scranton


The world of Continental philosophy has been shaped by two irreconcilable schools: German idealism on the one hand and phenomenology/existentialism on the other. If they can be called a tradition at all, it is not one of shared inheritance, but of continued revolt. Phenomenology/existentialism disdains German idealism's goal of seeking systematic totality insofar as it loses sight of the lived-experience of the individual human being. True, the idealist would argue that such lived-experience has not been lost, but preserved, albeit in a higher form and according to its immanent rational structure. For phenomenology/existentialism, however, such rational preservation renders inert and lifeless the very dynamism and spontaneity that characterized lived-experience in the first place. The distinction between the two can be simplified to various sets of irreconcilable dichotomies: systematicity vs. individuality, rational necessity vs. freedom, and so on.

This is the misconceived caricature that Jon Stewart's Idealism and Existentialism seeks to shatter. In this work, Stewart challenges this purported truism of irreconcilable antagonists by displaying the wealth of factors the two schools share, even if not always with the same intentions or toward the same results. The text is divided into three parts: The first covers Hegel and German idealism, exploring myths surrounding Hegel as an "arch-rationalist" in addition to more technical studies on the Phenomenology of Spirit. The second part takes up the relation between Hegelian idealism and the forms of proto-existentialism found in Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, and Nietzsche, targeting points of contact between supposed antagonists. The third part turns to a study of existentialism proper, with particular emphasis on the thought of Sartre and Merleau-Ponty.

For reasons to be discussed below, the thesis proposed in the introduction does little to unite this work into an integrated whole, and instead the chapters remain a series of loosely related studies. Stewart himself notes: "While the individual chapters each pursue their own goals with respect to specific texts or concepts, they are united in their attempt to reveal in one way or another the long shadow cast by Kant and Hegel over the subsequent history of European thought" (2). At times, the thesis shines through the individualized studies. With all but one chapter having been published previously, however, these stand-alone studies only indirectly reinforce each other to form a unified project. Although various elements of the text succeed, the project of bringing the two traditions closer together remains underdeveloped, making for a somewhat loosely stitched-together patchwork whose overall contribution could be enhanced by greater communication among the chapters themselves.

Chapter 1, "Hegel and the Myth of Reason," challenges one of the many myths surrounding Hegel, the myth of Hegel as an unapologetic and uncompromising rationalist. The myth relies on passages from the Hegelian corpus such as the oft-cited "what is rational is actual and what is actual is rational,"[1] which seem to entail everything that should be is and everything that is should be. Against such a myth, Stewart proposes a view of Hegel not as the last Aufklärer, but instead as a herald of irrationalism (12). He evaluates this claim by analyzing select passages from the Phenomenology of Spirit in which Enlightenment reason comes into conflict with religion. In particular, Stewart focuses on Hegel's use of illness and infection to understand the work of reason: "[reason] has attacked the marrow of spiritual life,"[2] Hegel states, referring to the infection of faith by Enlightenment's pure insight. In asking for faith to account for itself, reason finds it unable to do so. Reflection disrupts the immediacy of pre-reflective life by overtaking its host and requiring it to defend itself through reason, thereby transforming its very nature as immediate (i.e., pre-reflective). This metaphor, Stewart notes, foreshadows a recurring theme in the existentialist tradition of associating reason with disease and the rational life with sickness; for example, Camus' The Plague or Sartre's Nausea. Stewart does not imply a direct influence of Hegel on such existential authors, merely a common conception of how reason infects pre-reflective life.

Although there is certainly a connection, it remains tangential at best and does little work for the overall project of the book. By focusing primarily on the conflict between Enlightenment reason and religion, no doubt the alienating influence of reason will be found. But such a view of reason's destructive influence is one-sided. Like existentialism, Hegel is "aware of" the negativity and perniciousness wrought by history, culture, and reflection. But what clearly divides Hegel "the rationalist" from existentialism and makes the mantra of "forerunner of irrationalism" ill-suited is the fact that Hegelian negativity is necessarily recoverable. Destruction is a necessary moment in the process, but not its final moment. In other words, we are not left interminably abandoned to the sickness of our despair, but saved through the totalizing movement of the Concept (Begriff). Existentialism speaks to the illness of living without recourse to rational meaning, the unsublatable alienation of a parasitic existence upon a foreign host indifferent or outright hostile to our very being. For Hegelian illness, however, the curative power lies within; that is, it is immanent to the illness itself as destructive preservation or sublation (Aufhebung). To claim that the destructiveness of history, culture, and reason makes Hegel an irrationalist, and thus less antagonistic to existentialism, neglects this positivity endemic to the very destructiveness of reason. Thus, this claim concerning Hegel's irrationalism seems to be off the mark.

In the following two chapters, Stewart treats questions of systematicity with regard to the Phenomenology. Chapter 2, "Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit as a Systematic Fragment," argues against attempts to abandon Hegel's own systematic pretenses, either for internal textual reasons or for external biographical ones. Stewart responds to both strategies of unraveling the text. Against the latter, he argues that external constraints alone do not provide sufficient reason for textual disorder, as shown by various counterexamples (e.g., Boethius' Consolation of Philosophy), and that Hegel's own reflections on the text reveal not disunity of structure, but only a hasty execution. As for the internal textual arguments, Stewart maintains that the seeming abruptness of key transitions can be better understood by textual parallelism or the interlacing of recurring themes, of which he gives a brief synopsis here, but takes up more fully in the following chapter. Chapter 3, "The Architectonic of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit," follows an approach similar to that of Chapter 2 and maintains that understandings of the Phenomenology as a fragmented text leads to an "erroneous interpretive approach" (41). Instead, Stewart labors to uncover the so-called intra-textual cross-references (i.e., textual parallelism) to which Hegel alludes in a letter to Schelling, but provides little help in discovering (43).

While both chapters provide insightful readings of the Phenomenology, they seem to run counter to the overall current of Stewart's argument. In arguing that truth is systematic for Hegel and thus cannot be isolated from a systematic presentation, Stewart manages to distance Hegelian idealism from the fragmentary, indirect, literary, and oftentimes aphoristic approach of existential writers to lived-experience. This criticism, however, does not diminsh these chapters' role as a compass for the labyrinthine Phenomenology. Chapter 3, in particular, graphs both textually and visually the complex structure of the text and its bizarre chapter designations in order to display the interrelation and repetition of themes. For example, "Chapter (CC) Religion" reconfigures "Chapter (BB) Spirit" insofar as spirit now becomes aware of itself; or Sense-certainty of "Chapter (A) Consciousness" is repeated, albeit at a higher level, in Observation of Nature of "Chapter (C)/(AA) Reason," The Ethical World of "Chapter (BB) Spirit" and God as Light of "Chapter (CC) Religion." Chapters 2 and 3 work against those who would pick at the corpse of the Hegelian system for salvageable remains.

The five chapters of Part II present "points of contact" between idealism and existentialism, with each chapter treating the relation between Hegel and a nineteenth-century "proto-existentialist" thinker. The bookends of Part II discuss shared conceptions of religion between Hegel and Schopenhauer (Chapter 4: "Points of Contact in the Philosophy of Religion of Hegel and Schopenhauer") and of the demise of Greek tragedy between Hegel and Nietzsche (Chapter 8: "Hegel and Nietzsche on the Death of Tragedy and Greek Ethical Life"). Between the bookends, one finds three chapters on Kierkegaard, which will be discussed in more detail below. Chapter 4 argues that despite their notoriously antagonistic relationship, Hegel and Schopenhauer share fundamental conceptions about religion, in spite of a difference of presuppositions and conclusions (73). They both agree that the truth of religion lies more with the activity of believers than with its ontological correctness, as well as that religion represents deeper philosophical truths through symbol or myth. Likewise, Chapter 8 maintains that the basic conceptual structure of The Birth of Tragedy is prefigured within the "Religion" chapter of the Phenomenology (145), along with a shared dialectical methodology. This is not to say that Nietzsche offers nothing new, but that focusing on these shared aspects of their thought can be just as productive as highlighting only their differences.

Part II is the section of the book where the underlying thesis finds its clearest expression, especially in Chapters 4 and 8. Even with these points of contact, however, the overarching project tends to get lost at points, especially in the three chapters on Kierkegaard. For example, Chapter 5, "Kierkegaard's Criticism of the Absence of Ethics in Hegel's System," brings to light the fundamental differences between Kierkegaard's ethical Lebensphilosophie and the idealists' conceptual analysis by way of a compelling study of Kierkegaard's misunderstanding of their technical conception of actuality (Wirklichkeit).[3] In concluding that Kierkegaard's criticism of the lack of ethics in Hegel's system pivots on a misunderstood conception of actuality, Stewart opens a chasm between the two traditions as opposed to bringing them closer together (92-93). In terms of "actuality," one must simply equivocate when speaking both ethical languages, an equivocation that Kierkegaard's existential dissatisfaction with idealistic abstraction fails to recognize. There may be a way of revealing a deeper continuity, but Chapter 5 leaves any such middle term unexamined and the sense of incommensurability lingering.

Any thematic continuity between Chapter 5 and the following two chapters also remains underdeveloped. In Chapter 6, "Kierkegaard's Criticism of Abstraction and His Proposed Solution: Appropriation," for example, there are helpful tools for thinking through the problems of the previous chapter. "Appropriation," which is Kierkegaard's answer to the problem of mediation between the universal categories and particular individuals, offers deeper insight into the movement between ethical principles and actual action. Unlike traditional forms of mediation, through which actuality comes to be objectified, "appropriation" makes a universal concept one's own "in a personal and free way without the support of any arguments of discursive rationality (which would be the sign of objective thinking)" (116). Stewart's conclusion that Kierkegaard also remains abstract in the very way he seeks to avoid (118) might shed light on the earlier question (Chapter 5) of how his concept of actuality ultimately speaks a common language with the idealists' language of actuality.

Chapter 7, "Kierkegaard's Recurring Criticism of Hegel's 'The Good and Conscience,'" asks why Kierkegaard continually returned to this chapter from Hegel's Philosophy of Right. In mapping Kierkegaard onto the various forms of subjectivism that "The Good and Conscience" considers, Stewart concludes that with concepts like the paradox, Kierkegaard "exempts himself from philosophical discourse altogether" (141). But if the Kierkegaardian existentialist simply exempts herself from rendering an account when pressed by the Hegelian idealist, the two do not so much occupy extreme points of a continuous tradition as altogether incommensurable paradigms, a conclusion seeming inimical to Stewart's project.

Part III comprises a generalized study of existential ethics and two chapters on specific points of contention between Sartre and Merleau-Ponty. Chapter 9, "Existentialist Ethics," in presenting a "who's who?" of existential thinkers, challenges the misconception that existentialism lacks an ethics. Besides a short discussion of Kantian autonomy, the chapter does more to distance existential ethics from idealism than to bring them closer together. Given its introductory character, the chapter moves briskly through thinkers and only breaks the surface at the end, reflecting upon (but then dropping) what has been an implicit (yet only loosely thematized) problem already: how can this tradition so thoroughly ensconced in the actual lived-experience of concrete individuals meaningfully engage a tradition centered on abstract ethical rules and principles? Stewart concludes that, as reminiscent of ancient forms of Greek Lebensphilosophie, existential ethics offers a "significant alternative" (198) to the tradition of formal rule-based theories. But as an alternative are we not left to assume that existential ethics simply rejects idealism, the very caricature that Stewart sought to dismantle? Stewart misses an opportunity here to show how Hegel also criticizes Kant's empty formalism by grounding it in "ethical life" (Sittlichkeit).[4] Abstract morality, for Hegel, must be rooted in the concrete sphere of ethical life, or "the concept of freedom which has become the existing [vorhandenen] world".[5] Existentialists such as Kierkegaard remain suspicious of Hegelian ethical life,[6] as Stewart himself noted in Chapter 7 (131), nevertheless Chapter 9 would greatly benefit if it were to discuss the ways in which both Hegelian idealism and existentialism seek to re-embody ethics in concrete life.

A number of previously discussed themes reappear in Chapter 9, but without incorporating the earlier discussions. Three repeated themes, in particular, which could strengthen the narrative arch, stand out as deserving attention. First, Stewart might connect the discussion of existential ethics as Lebensphilosophie with the conclusion of Chapter 5, which had argued that Kierkegaard's ethical Lebensphilosophie misapplies the concept of actuality in criticizing idealistic ethics. The introduction of Hegelian ethical life as a common denominator would provide an opportune moment for further reflection upon actuality in order to draw closer the ethical traditions that Chapters 5 and 9 set apart. Second, notwithstanding concerns addressed above, recurring ethical themes in existential literature (e.g., Camus' The Plague and Sartre's Nausea), which echo discussions of the shared metaphor of "illness" from Chapter 1, could be highlighted more prominently. Here in Chapter 9, the experience of living in a meaningless world and the sickness felt in the face of ungrounded freedom separates existential ethics from idealism, when according to his thesis Stewart should be bringing them closer together. Third, Kierkegaard's famous account of Abraham's sacrifice of Isaac from Fear and Trembling is presented (172). Stewart had already told it in Chapters 6 and 7, and gave a partial retelling in Chapter 5 (89). One might expect that such repetition from various vantage points would highlight a deeper set of issues in Kierkegaard's thought, in particular with relation to idealism. But the retellings are not integrated and do little to reinforce one another. In addition, Chapter 9 does not set up more philosophically significant problems for existential ethics. This fourth installment, in particular, reads as an overly simplified textbook summary whose inattentiveness to problems addressed by its predecessors makes it flat and redundant.

The concluding chapters 10, "Merleau-Ponty's Criticisms of Sartre's Theory of Freedom," and 11, "Sartre and Merleau-Ponty on Consciousness and Bad Faith," contribute much to connecting these two thinkers. Chapter 11, for example, uses the Freudian unconscious -- which Sartre and Merleau-Ponty both reject, but for different reasons -- to uncover a leitmotiv of each theory of consciousness and self-deception: transparent choice and ambiguity, respectively. By centering on disputes within the existential community, they allow deeper questions to linger about how these issues (e.g., consciousness, freedom, etc.) link existentialism with its purportedly estranged idealist forerunner. There is much in the work of both thinkers that is indebted directly and indirectly to the idealist tradition. For example, regarding questions of consciousness, Sartre's early Transcendence of the Ego provides a clear link between existentialism proper and idealism by way of Husserlian phenomenology.[7] In analyzing the structures of consciousness, the Transcendence shows that Husserl's positing of a transcendental ego necessarily accompanying all acts of consciousness closes off our existential access "to the things themselves," thus making consciousness egological and idealistic: a hair's breadth separates existential phenomenology from idealism. Stewart only highlights Sartre's later and fully existential treatment of this issue in Being and Nothingness, in which he discusses the pre-reflective cogito, or the ego that can accompany any act of consciousness upon reflection, but need not necessarily accompany such acts prior to reflection. Notwithstanding the merits of this discussion, reference to the more strictly phenomenological work of Transcendence would highlight how Sartre does not naively break with the tradition of idealism, but phenomenologically struggles against idealism over the disputed territory of consciousness.

The text ends with Chapter 11 without offering a separate conclusion. One seeking a sustained inquiry into the oftentimes acrimonious, but always familial, branches of continental philosophy will find a continuously insightful, but patchy and somewhat opaque, discussion of this topic.

[1] G.W.F. Hegel, Elements of the Philosophy of Right, trans. H.B. Nisbet (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991), p. 20.

[2] G.W.F. Hegel, Spirit: Chapter Six of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit, trans. The Hegel Translation Group (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2001), p. 79.

[3] For a more in-depth discussion of this point by Stewart, see also Jon Stewart, Kierkegaard's Relations to Hegel Reconsidered (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003), p. 383.

[4] For Hegel's critique of empty formalism, see Hegel, Philosophy of Right, p. 162. For the transition from "Morality" to "Ethical Life," see ibid., pp. 185-186.

[5] Ibid., p. 189.

[6] Søren Kierkegaard, Fear and Trembling, trans. Howard V. Hong and Edna H. Hong (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1983), pp. 55-67.

[7] Jean-Paul Sartre, Transcendence of the Ego: An Existentialist Theory of Consciousness, trans. Forrest Williams and Robert Kirkpatrick (New York: The Noonday Press, 1957), pp. 38-40