Idealism: New Essays in Metaphysics

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Tyron Goldschmidt and Kenneth L. Pearce (ed.), Idealism: New Essays in Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2017, 336 pp., $60.00, ISBN 9780198746973.

Reviewed by Adam P. Taylor, North Dakota State University


The familiar narrative about the early days of analytic philosophy tells us of its triumph over the needless metaphysical excesses of its immediate forerunners, the idealists. In one form or another, idealism was the paramount philosophical view of the 19th century. Nowadays, however, the bulwarks of idealism are largely abandoned. Few defend the view, and fewer still are willing to take the time to consider its claims seriously. Materialism and dualism dominate the philosophical landscape.

The essays offered in this volume are, the editors tell us, intended to "correct the unjustified neglect of idealism by presenting a variety of arguments for and against various versions of idealism" (p. ix). In this project, the contributors succeed marvelously. The material presented here is wide ranging, highly engaging, and likely to be of interest to philosophers and students working on any of a number of ongoing debates in metaphysics, philosophy of mind, epistemology, and philosophy of language, philosophy of religion, and philosophy of science.

To give some indication of the breathtaking scope of the ground covered in this collection, here is a (somewhat brief) synopsis of the views on offer.

Todd Buras and Trent Dougherty argue in favor of idealism on the grounds, first proposed by Berkeley and later advanced by Robert Adams, that the intrinsic non-formal qualities of objects must be conscious qualities, or strongly analogous to conscious qualities (p. 2).

Robert Smithson argues that even in possible scenarios where an infallible oracle informs us that our object judgments are false, our object discourse would not change, presumably because it is rooted in our experience. According to Smithson the best explanation for this behavior is that truths about objects do not in fact outstrip our experiences as the realist claims (p. 22).

Aaron Segal and Tyron Goldschmidt argue that Idealism, if true at all, is necessarily true (p. 36). From there, they consider alternative necessary ontological schemes, physicalism and impurism (views that are neither purely physical nor mental). They conclude that physicalism, and property dualism (the strongest of the impure views) are untenable.

Graham Oppy argues against idealism and in favor of naturalism on the grounds that the latter is more parsimonious as ultimate explanation of reality. More on this below.

Helen Yetter-Chappell argues that, contrary to the Berkeleyan conception, there is a plausible version of idealism that need not posit theism. On her view, the role played by God in Berkeley's theory (that is the role of unifying and stabilizing the conscious experience of finite minds), can be played by a vast, external unity of consciousness independent of all finite minds.

The volume then turns from a discussion of the Berkeleyan strain of idealism to the Kantian and post-Kantian.

Nicholas Stang offers an accessible, contemporary discussion of Kantian metaphysics, focusing on the epistemological constraints Kant's system places on us. Ontology can be explanatorily useful only if constrained to phenomena, thus ruling out certain darlings of the metaphysician's menagerie (instantaneous temporal parts, philosophical zombies, possible worlds, etc).

Next, in the most technical and challenging material in the collection, Arif Ahmed argues in favor of the Kantian view that the unity of the self entails the objectivity of experience, and from this Ahmed derives an argument against idealism of the Berkeleyan sort.

Thomas Hofweber argues for a conceptual (alethic) version of idealism that allows for the possibility that while what is real is mind-independent, we cannot say the same for what is the case. Facts may well depend on our human minds insofar as what facts can obtain may depend on what facts we are capable (in principle) of representing.

Lastly, Kris McDaniel discusses an unfortunately overlooked personalist version of absolute idealism defended by a pioneering woman in philosophy, Mary Whiton Calkins. According to personalism, the Absolute is "strictly and literally" a person (p. 144). This view set Calkins apart from her contemporaneous peers (e.g., McTaggart and Bradley). Fascinatingly, Calkins also held that we as finite persons are proper parts of the personal Absolute.

Two contributions discuss idealism outside mainstream Western philosophy. The first is Sam Lebens' treatment of idealism within the tradition of Hassidic rabbis (and the fiction of Kurt Vonnegut), who held that reality could be understood as a divine dream or a story that God is telling. He uses this insight to address several theological difficulties in Kabbalah and even (cursorily) in Christianity. Second, Bronwyn Finnigan surveys and evaluates various forms of idealism that developed historically within the Yogācāra school of Buddhism.

In the penultimate group of essays, the tools of idealism are brought to bear on two important ongoing questions in analytic metaphysics: the problem of grounding, and the analysis of the relation of causation.

Kenneth Pearce offers an idealist response to Peter van Inwagen's Special Composition Question. Two or more objects compose a third in those cases where they are co-apprehended in act of representation by a conscious individual.

Sara Bernstein, while making it clear that she favors an objective realist account of causation, argues nonetheless that an idealist account of causation, wherein:

c is a cause of e only if at least one observer mentally projects a causal relation between c and e. (p. 218)

is no less plausible than the more au courant mind-dependent, non-objective, theories of the contextualists, contrastivists, and pragmatists.

The last four chapters deal with the relationship idealism, explanation, and science. Daniel Greco formulates idealism as a claim about grounding, and then argues that theism entails idealism (of this sort), and demonstrates how this entailment impedes those considering certain theistic arguments (particularly arguments from design or fine tuning) from dualistic or physicalistic standpoints. To accept the conclusion of the argument would necessitate abandoning their preferred philosophy of mind, a great theoretical cost.

Jacob Ross argues that if the universe is fine-tuned for consciousness, then the best (read simplest and most unified) explanation of this fact is that explanatory idealism (the view that a mentalistic fact plays a crucial role in explaining a wide range of prime facie mind-independent facts) is true. If this is so, then we can explain numerous facts about the fundamental physical parameters of the universe in terms of their being necessary to support consciousness (p. 252). Thus, consciousness is the final cause of the existence of the universe.

Marc Lange discusses another version of idealism putatively found in Thomas Kuhn's The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962). According to Lange, certain remarks of Kuhn's can be construed as endorsing the claim that scientists working in incommensurate paradigms (e.g. Newton physics, and Relativistic physics) are in fact investigating different (idealistic) worlds (p. 272). This is because the paradigm is partially constitutive of reality for that scientist. Lange calls this Kuhnian idealism. Against Kuhnian idealism, Lange argues that the incommensurability of paradigms is insufficient to warrant Kuhnian Idealism.

Susan Schneider argues that the physicalist lacks the requisite theoretical resources to give an adequate account of the nature of mathematical entities. This is problematic especially due to the relation between mathematics and fundamental physics, which relies on mathematical entities in order to explain reality. In light of this difficulty, Schneider argues that idealism, and something near enough to idealism, panprotopsychism (or what she calls 'protomentalism') is a more promising view.

As can be seen, the range of material in this volume is more than can be treated in this review. I will limit myself to a few comments on the chapters by Oppy and Schneider.

Graham Oppy's "Against Idealism" offers the sort of brisk anti-idealist argument that proponents of the view will find very familiar. His goal is compare the theoretical virtues of idealism against those of the sort of naturalism that he finds more philosophically compelling. He begins with a rough characterization of the two views: he characterizes the naturalist as being committed to the following (p. 55):

1N. Fundamental causal reality is entirely natural.

2N. Mindedness is late and local in the causal order.

3N. Mindedness is explained in terms of neural and other biological processes that occur in natural organisms in natural environments with appropriate natural histories.

4N. Human beings are minded organisms.

While he characterizes the idealist as being committed to:.

1I. Fundamental causal reality is entirely mental.

2I. Minds are neither late nor local in the causal order.

3I. 'Non-mental objects' are fully explained in terms of the 'contents' of minds.

4I. Human beings are minds.

With these characterizations in hand, and after declaring both positions internally coherent, Oppy then turns to a critical evaluation of the competing views on the basis of their ontological, ideological, nomological parsimony. Leaving aside the issue of whether either of these characterizations is felicitous, let me say something about Oppy's overall argument against idealism and in favor of naturalism.

It is less than ideal. For example, here is Oppy on the ontological commitments of the naturalist vs. the idealist:

On the one hand, [the naturalist] is committed to the denizens of the universe -- minded organisms, sofas, sculptures, cars, cities, rivers, planets, stars, and so on -- and to nothing else. On the other hand, [the idealist] is committed to all the denizens of the universe -- minded organisms, sofas, sculptures, cars, cities, rivers, planets, stars, and so on -- as well as to a supernatural mind, to minds for all minded organisms, and (perhaps) to 'contents' in all of the minds . . . so on point of ontological commitment, [the naturalist] is the clear winner: [the idealist] is committed to all of the ontology to which [the naturalist] is committed, and more besides. (p. 58)

However, contrary to Oppy's assessment of "clear victory" for the naturalist, it is not clear to me that the naturalist's ontology is any more parsimonious than the idealist's. Suppose the naturalist is committed to simplest, sparsest, version of her view. All that exists is spacetime, some properties, and sets, and from this she can build all of the other objects that make up the observable universe of "minded organisms, sofas, sculptures, cars . . . ". That gives three kinds of basic entities. The idealist, however, needs only one kind of basic entity, an experiencing mind (or some experiencing minds). Given the existence of experiencing minds, the idealist can account for all the variegated structure of physical reality. As I see it, this makes idealism the austere view.

I am more sympathetic with Susan Schneider's "Idealism, Or Something Near Enough." Indeed, I find a great deal to agree with in her careful, and decisive, attack on physicalism. Schneider argues that physicalism stands astride a contradiction. On the one hand, the physicalist maintains everything in reality is either a fundamental physical entity or depends upon a fundamental physical entity in its (supervenience) base. On the other hand, the physicalist is committed to the idea that, at least in part, what individuates physical entities are certain mathematical facts. But mathematical facts are best construed as facts about abstracta, and hence the physicalist cannot accommodate them in her ontology. Schneider calls this the "problem of the base" (p. 277).

After raising this problem, and showing that standard physicalism lacks the resources to resolve it, Schneider turns to more exotic forms of physicalism that have been gaining ground in the last few years: property dualism and panpsychism. There is not room for a lengthy discussion here, but I think her critiques of these views are well founded. Eventually, she settles on panprotopsychism, or as she calls it, 'protomentalism' as her preferred view. As she characterizes it, protomentalism:

Puts quasi-mentalistic ingredients at the fundamental layer of reality -- the level of the fundamental physical properties characterized by a completed physics. This is a non-physicalist monism, for the fundamental ontology is not purged of anything mental, as the physicalist would have it . . . This is not idealism either, for these truthmakers are not full blown mental properties. But the view is close to idealism, as the fundamental ingredients are protomental. (p. 288-9)p

Perhaps it is my own shortcoming, but I think many readers, especially those inclined toward an idealist position, will share my perplexity at this talk of the quasi-mental. Schneider balks, correctly I think, at the panpsychist's talk of fundamental particles having microsubjectivity, or microexperience, but I find micro-quasi-mentalistic properties equally as troublesome, if not more so. At least in the case of microexperience, I have some concept of what it is to have an experience, and thus some (albeit flimsy) notion of what is being attributed to the micro-entity. But I have absolutely no concept of the quasi-mental, and thus no concept at all of what it means to attribute quasi-mentalistic properties to a micro-entity. For this reason, I think that those convinced by Schneider's wonderful case against physicalism (in any of its forms), should opt instead for idealism.

I found this volume enormously fruitful, and I have no doubt that the contributions it contains will inform much of the discussion of idealism in the years to come. The wide ranging and lively discussions here demonstrate that idealism (in various forms) is a viable research project that deserves to once again assume its place as alternative to both materialist physicalism and dualism in a number of philosophical debates.