Idealism without Absolutes: Philosophy and Romantic Culture

Placeholder book cover

Rajan, Tilottama, and Plotnitsky, Arkady (eds.), Idealism without Absolutes: Philosophy and Romantic Culture, SUNY Press, 2004, 262pp, $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 0791460010.

Reviewed by Dean Moyar, Johns Hopkins University


Philosophic texts are ubiquitous in courses in the humanities and much of the social sciences today. Nearly every discipline, in search of a theoretical framework, has come to need philosophic props for the study of its distinctive subject matter. Members of the official philosophy profession can see this phenomenon as good news or bad news. It is good news if we value above all the dissemination of the great works in the philosophical tradition, and see in today’s movement a greater realization that philosophy is necessary to authorize and situate the results of the other fields of study. The widespread use of philosophy will be seen as bad news by those holding to a strict and professionalized sense of what doing philosophy is all about. From a certain standard of how philosophic claims are made and cashed out, and with a premium on precision of sense, much of the work done with philosophy from other disciplines is bound to appear an abuse of the tradition and perhaps even an affront to the very standards of rational analysis at the core of philosophy’s self-image. Whether or not one appreciates the essays collected in Idealism Without Absolutes will depend in large part on which of these two views one takes. Inclining towards the former, ecumenical view, I found the collection very rich in the issues raised and points discussed, though the arguments are generally more provocative than convincing. The essays, from authors in various humanities disciplines, differ severely in style and argumentative structure. While some pieces make recognizable contributions to the body of scholarship on German Idealism and its aftermath, others are more concerned with what we can get out of idealism for the contemporary metatheoretical enterprise. What the reader gets out of the essays in the latter category depends primarily on the concerns from contemporary theory that she brings to the table.

First I should say a few words about the professed intentions of the editors. The overarching purpose of the book is to explore the legacy of idealism with the assumption that Hegel’s telling and closure of idealism’s history need not be final. In her introduction, Rajan identifies the space between Kant’s original transcendental idealism and Hegel’s totalizing solution with a certain “romantic culture,” citing the need to recapture the “romantic moment” within idealism. Part of this project is to explore the move by the various thinkers under consideration (especially Hölderlin, Novalis, the Schlegels) to go interdisciplinary themselves, to write in different genres outside the traditional forms of philosophizing. Rajan ties the notion of interdisciplinarity to the book’s guiding intuition of an idealism without absolutes. This latter phrase is of course directed against Hegel’s various claims that are often casually referred to under the heading of Absolute Knowledge. Of all the Hegelian sins, completeness or closure is the worst; Plotnitsky’s central claims, drawing especially on Derrida, de Man and Deleuze, insist that the circle cannot be closed, that there is always a remainder in the dialectical process. One senses that there is an underlying intuitive appeal to freedom from “the system” here, though the point of this freedom is never really spelled out. The central cause of disruption to the enclosing System is the confrontation with what Rajan refers to as “materiality,” a term that stands loosely for the non-conceptual in all its guises. The challenge is deciding how the thinkers on display in these essays do not become “mere romantics” when the normative destination is always, inevitably, deferred.

The editors are certainly right that the terrain that this collection explores is understudied. The issue of the unity of the Kantian corpus, or how the epistemological emphasis of the First Critique, the “primacy of the practical” claim of the Second Critique, and the aesthetic-teleological issues of the Third Critique are to be fit into a single picture, is indeed a central preoccupation for all post-Kantian thought. The complex of issues surrounding those intersections, and the question of systematicity (or totality) that so determines Fichte’s and Hegel’s idealism, deserve more attention. Too often in the literature the epistemic and practical issues are dealt with independently, and the Third Critique is approached with a narrow set of concerns. Too often one’s attitude towards Hegel’s systematizing seems to be necessarily an all-or-nothing affair. On the question of the System, most of this volume explores the avenues for opting out of complete systematicity, and those avenues are, I think, helpfully categorized as forms of romanticism. While most of the essays engage in some manner with Hegel, many exhibit a pervasive weakness shared by all the disciplines that deal with this period, namely a neglect of Fichte and his decisive influence on the possibilities of post-Kantian thought. Fichte ought properly to be called the father of philosophical romanticism, since his radicalization of the Kantian method and insistence on the dual need to both posit limitations and surpass them set the terms for the mind-world relation explored in so many different ways by those exposed to his teaching at Jena in the 1790s.

I cannot hope to do critical justice to the eleven essays that constitute this collection, so I will focus on two groups of three and on one essay that I found especially helpful. The three essays by Jan Plug, Rajan and Plotnitsky belong together as exemplars of “high theory,” virtuoso performances of the genre of re-reading classic texts through the lens of “postmodern” intellectuals such as Lyotard, Derrida and Deleuze. Plug takes his principal inspiration from Phillippe Lacoue-Labarthe and Jean-Luc Nancy, tracing the notion of the “literary absolute” to the writings of Kant, Schelling and A.W. Schlegel. Plug has gathered together some interesting passages, and certainly the idea of an absolute that, qua literary, is self-undermining, has a certain appeal in liberal societies. Yet Plug’s language remains at such a high metalevel throughout that I am not entirely sure what is accomplished (typical phrases: “the dead body of language is never fully laid to rest” (22), “style also speaks another language” (30), “the dismembering of the embodied ideal” (33)). Also concerned primarily with categories of the aesthetic and their relationship to philosophy proper, Rajan’s essay takes off from Lyotard’s discussion of the Kantian sublime. In an example of the disconnect between “theory” as performed in this essay and “philosophy” as produced by historians of philosophy, Rajan claims that reading Hegel with Kant rather than against him is somehow exceptional (a wealth of literature on just his connection over the last twenty years has done much to revive the interest in Hegel in philosophy departments). The connections that are drawn between Kant’s and Hegel’s terminology and commitments are left too vague to be productive for understanding Kant’s deep influence on Hegel. I found especially misleading Rajan’s conflation of Kant’s technical uses of judgment in the Third Critique and Hegel’s “judgments” about various art forms in his Aesthetics. Plotnitsky’s essay, “Curvatures,” reads Hegel through Deleuze’s notion of the “fold.” Though I found the connection somewhat enlightening for understanding what Hegel means by a concept (and The Concept), the cascading references to other authors and texts seemed too much a species of “play” and not enough an effort to understand why we need to speak Hegel’s language. The indulgence in metaphor, with gestures towards mathematical models and manifold examples of the baroque tendency in Hegel’s thought, left me rather more bewildered than enlightened as to how Deleuze’s insights can help us decipher the complexities of Hegel’s system.

The essays by Gary Handwerk, David Farrell Krell, and John Smyth, are all solid contributions to appreciating the alternatives to Hegel’s program developed during this period. Handwerk’s essay takes up the least known part of Friedrich Schlegel’s writings, namely those after his 1808 conversion to Catholicism and move to Vienna. In particular, Handwerk focuses on Schlegel’s historicism, its “rigorously antisystematic character,” (95) and his emphasis on locality. Especially provocative are Handwerk’s discussions of Schlegel’s attitude towards Greek culture (and its limitations), and the discussion of how Schlegel came to see in other world cultures, especially the Indian, an alternative to the myth of Greece as THE original Western culture. Rather than focusing on one figure, Krell in his essay, “Three Ends of the Absolute”, takes up a family of themes in three figures, namely Schelling, Hölderlin, and Novalis. The basic problematic for all three of these thinkers comes from Fichte, for whom the self-positing of the I depends on an opposing not-I (Krell to his credit acknowledges that he is skipping an all-important discussion in bypassing Fichte). For Krell’s three “romantics,” the moment of opposition becomes the shape of absolute inhibition (Schelling), absolute separation (Hölderlin), and absolute density (Novalis). In each case, Krell links this oppositional absolute, the absolute as what cannot be finally overcome, to those themes which (supposedly) get lost in Fichte’s and Hegel’s idealism, such as heterogeneity and individuality. Though Krell’s presentation is necessarily more suggestive than conclusive, his way of linking these three writers does set off certain resonances that will be fruitful for any student of the period.

Smyth’s essay, “Sacrificial and Erotic Materialism in Kierkegaard and Adorno,” opens with the sentence, “The sheer variety of uses to which Kierkegaard has been prostituted might raise the question of whether his seductiveness is not in inverse proportion to rigor.” (182) Smyth is out to correct the various misapprehensions of Kierkegaard’s project, and of Kierkegaard’s absolute subjectivity, to mark out a space that brings him in a sense closer to Hegel, but for that reason also leaves him better situated to provide a real (rather than question-begging) alternative to Hegel. Smyth uses Adorno as both an ally to save Kierkegaard from himself (from his tendency to absolutize the paradox of subjectivity) and as an enemy to show that Kierkegaard’s resources for critique are stronger than usually appreciated. Focusing on The Concept of Dread, Smyth unpacks Kierkegaard’s critiques of sacrificial ideologies, finding in the theme of sacrifice a key to Kierkegaard’s overall idealist-materialist commitments. I would have appreciated more detail on the notion of “mimesis” central to Smyth’s analysis, but Smyth generally makes up for the sin of going too fast by the cogency of the overall argument.

The final, and to my mind the most illuminating essay of the volume, by Richard Beardsworth, actually takes direct issue with the guiding programmatic claim of the volume. In the essay, entitled “Futures of Spirit: Hegel, Nietzsche, and Beyond,” Beardsworth sets up his concerns by noting that the dominant trend in “Continental Philosophy” is to cast Hegel, and a unified notion of reason, under suspicion in favor of radical Nietzschean critique. Beardsworth is concerned to show that this opposition is “philosophically disempowering” (219), and rests on a misplaced critique of reason. In particular, Beardsworth wants to demonstrate that the criticisms of Hegel from a Husserlian or Heideggerian perspective are misguided because they underestimate the role of experience in the formation and reformation of Spirit. Though Beardsworth’s argument is somewhat odd as a defense of Hegel, resting as it does on a reading of the very early unpublished text The Spirit of Christianity and its Fate, the conclusions Beardsworth draws are consonant with the spirit of Hegel’s philosophy throughout his writings. For Beardsworth the importance of Hegel lies in his stress on determinacy, and on the disruptions life (or “consciousness” in the terms of The Phenomenology of Spirit) suffers at its own hands, a “recognition of life” that “works toward ever-greater inclusivity in its determination of difference.” (224) As a function of reason, this process is supposed to be transparent in a way that liberates humans from the merely positive. The scorn of this transparency in much recent “Continental” thought is, for Beardsworth, its great mistake. Citing Levinas, Derrida, Lyotard and Deleuze, Beardsworth charges that their denial of conceptual thinking’s primacy is

(1) to renounce the ethical work and risk of rational thought to determine differences, and (2) to justify this renunciation as epistemological modesty. As a result, philosophy curtails its speculative powers of reason to open things up. This leaves differences in the world unarticulated either for fear of determining difference or in the understandable joy of celebrating the singular. (225)

This seems to me just the right thing to say, at the global level, to the endlessly repeated attacks on Hegel as closed, stuffy, totalizing, etc. Beardsworth himself is not content to rest with the “gesture of idealism” that he recovers from Hegel, but rather moves to discussing how Hegel and Nietzsche can be brought together, in part, through the term “speculative materialism.” (230) Without being sure how useful this term is in the end, I do think Beardsworth’s discussion of Hegel and Nietzsche’s complementary (if not convergent) approaches to “the concrete” is a call that should be heeded by scholars of both thinkers and by students of their twentieth-century descendents.

The great unanswered question for me in reading the essays in this volume concerns the status of the claims made on behalf of, or against, the various thinkers in the idealist tradition. In particular, the question of transcendental method, initiated by Kant and severely altered by Fichte and Hegel, is never tackled head on. Yet these thinkers had very good reasons to spend so much of their efforts working out a methodology. In part they were responding to various skepticisms current in the 18th century, and in part they were attempting to unify theoretical and practical reason. For all their obscurities, they were trying to find complementary answers to the questions, “what can we know?” and “what should we do?” They thought that the only method that could deliver answers, answers that could be defended as normatively binding, would be based on the principle of self-consciousness. In part because much of the theory represented in Idealism without Absolutes is motivated by aesthetic concerns, rather than epistemological or ethical, such primary questions largely go missing. Overall, however, the volume does the service of adding to our appreciation of how rich the period is, how important these thinkers remain, and how they might after all offer the resources for a comprehensive vision of the humanities.