Idealist Ethics

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W. J. Mander, Idealist Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2016, 276pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198748892.

Reviewed by Jon Garthoff, University of Tennessee


1. A central idea of W. J. Mander's Idealist Ethics is that something went very wrong, during the early modern period, with the development of ethical theory. As Mander sees it, the mind-body dualism of Rene Descartes lies near the source of the problem. In Mander's view Cartesian dualism erred in positing a gulf between the value-laden mental or ideal and the value-free physical or material, a gulf theorists -- dualist or physicalist -- have not bridged. Mander's prescription is to cease trying, and instead to view this gulf as illusory. This advance in ethics is to be accomplished by revivifying idealist metaphysics.

The first of the book's seven parts distills idealism as a philosophical tradition. Mander defines idealism as "a commitment to the primacy of ideas in any understanding of the universe" (6, Mander's italics). He prefers this to the more familiar formulation where all things depend on minds for their existence, as he is noncommittal "whether we suppose ideas depend on minds, or minds depend on ideas" (10). I find the second of these suppositions difficult to comprehend, but Mander is open about its appeal to him. This is an early indication of his tolerance for both the vague and the outlandish.

The vagueness of many of Mander's central suggestions is fortunately offset by his fine prose. Sentences are constructed well; the book is highly readable. Mander writes knowledgeably about a great many canonical idealist thinkers, including Plato, Leibniz, Berkeley, Kant, Fichte, Hegel, Schopenhauer, Green, Bradley, Bosanquet, and Royce. One of the book's chief values is considering these philosophers in juxtaposition. Mander additionally seeks to regenerate interest in non-canonical figures who were prominent in their own day, such as Hermann Lotze (who, as Mander notes, has enjoyed some renewed interest through the efforts of Frederick Beiser) and John McTaggart (who is known for his work on time, but whose writings on ethics are ignored); and he aims further to generate interest in figures not read by contemporary philosophers, such as Edward Caird and Marietta Kies. I lack sufficient familiarity with some of these figures to write intelligently about their treatment here, and the list is too long to comment on each. But it would anyway not be in the spirit of Idealist Ethics to do so, for this is not mainly a work for intellectual historians. While Mander notes differences among the many thinkers he discusses, the work does not explain their relationships in detail. It serves rather as a sourcebook of how idealist doctrines were developed by past thinkers. In this historical ambition the work is a success, and in this use the book is a valuable resource for students and for ethicists not steeped in idealist thought.

2. The second part of the book attempts to show how idealism enables an ethical theory, by denying the gap between facts and values, to avoid pitfalls of contemporary ethics. Paramount among these is fixation on a putative opposition between realism and anti-realism. Anti-realism is perennially suspected of lacking sufficient objectivity. Realism is perennially accused of inviting mystery about how the values it posits are genuinely normative, how these values could exist, and how we could know of them if they did. Through its bold hypothesis that all reality is laden with value, idealism purportedly obviates this conundrum: "to the idealist there holds only an apparent, and not a fundamental opposition between realism and anti-realism" (60).

The third part of the book contains three arguments for idealism. The exposition of each argument includes points of interest, but each fails to make distinctions necessary for evaluation of its success. The first is the "argument from value and valuing", which concludes: "It is only insofar as they are valued, that things can have any value." (59-61) This sounds a familiar theme from contemporary meta-ethics, cast here in an idealist frame. This discussion is engaging but brief. It overlooks central problem cases, especially status-values like dignity, which are difficult to understand as dependent on valuing. Complications arising from consideration of animals and children are also not considered; the less sophisticated (or nonexistent) representational capacities of these individuals put pressure on the thought that their well-being is good in virtue of being valued. (More generally Idealist Ethics does not systematically distinguish among consciousness, perception, judgment, and critical reason.) An absorbing later passages refers back to the theme of this argument. This passage concerns the "self-reflexive nature of value", a putative connection between value and consciousness (124-126). The obscurity of this discussion is excusable in view of the difficulty of its topic.

Second comes the related, more specific "Kantian argument from autonomy". Disputes between constructivist and realist understandings of Kant's view that morality depends on activity of the will are putatively resolved -- or perhaps dissolved -- by an "Augustinian" identification of morality with rational willing (83-86). This is presented as akin to a putative dissolution of the Euthyphro problem by identifying goodness with God. Again the hypothesis is of interest but not developed in detail. Mander appropriately compares it with Christine Korsgaard's Neo-Kantian constructivism, but does not do so at sufficient length, given that she attempts a related maneuver without commitment to Kant's idealism (82-83).[1]

Third is the "axiarchic argument", which holds that the truth of idealism would explain why there is something rather than nothing, since that is better than the alternative (87-99). This argument is as speculative as it sounds.

3. In my judgment the most significant part of the book is its discussion of ethical ideals, which appears mainly in the fifth part, though the topic is anticipated in the concluding chapter of the fourth, on self-realization (155-165). (The remainder of the fourth part is on hedonism and on idealist conceptions of the will (131-154).) As Mander notes Nicholas Rescher is not correct to claim ethical ideals are distinguished from other norms by their unrealizability (171-173).[2] Better is Mander's insightful formulation: "qua ideal it is indifferent to its realization" (172, Mander's italics). Ideals are distinctive not because they cannot be realized, but because the way they norm action is not well captured by asking whether they have been realized. On a productive model of moral agency, where actions are assessed only by behaviors that constitute them or consequences they cause, this significance of ethical ideals cannot be captured.[3]

Another engaging suggestion is drawn from Bradley, namely that "each individual must be understood as in search of his own ideal" (176, Mander's italics). This is no existentialism; the contextualism of ethics and the complexity of our personalities and social circumstances, rather, make self-perfecting partly an idiosyncratic task. Here as elsewhere helpful suggestions of earlier idealists are introduced, but Mander does not make clear how they are best developed today. The resulting discussion is intriguing, but perhaps better explored with a less ecumenical method.

It is also unfortunate this discussion does not engage John Rawls's conception of "ideal theory". Rawls appears in Idealist Ethics only briefly and cast as an antagonist; his emphasis on the "separateness of persons" is presented as an obstacle to altruism (217).[4] While Rawls did not avow idealist metaphysics, he was strongly influenced by idealist thinkers -- obviously Kant and Hegel, but also notably Royce. It is a strength of Rawls's work, furthermore, that he conceives political justice as an ideal to be shared rather than as an outcome to be achieved, a view which resonates with Mander's discussion of ethical ideals. This omission is particularly unfortunate given that the main aim of the book's sixth part is to show how idealism enables a rich conception of community by broadening human perspectives.

4. In my judgment the greatest weakness of Idealist Ethics is its treatment of teleology. Mander crucially fails to distinguish teleology clearly from psychology, and so never confronts the most significant challenge to his idealism.[5] He writes: "Teleology is best understood as of the same general class as intentionality . . . What the two phenomena have in common is that both are modes of relation to things which may lack any assignable place in the spatio-temporal causal matrix . . . To the naturalistic world view this is mysterious." (101, Mander's italics) Later Mander contends: "It is plausible enough to say that there can be no value except where there is will and sentience, but on the idealistic scheme this covers absolutely everything that exists. The whole of reality is saturated with value." (250, Mander's italics) These passages encourage conflations that provide idealism with a misleading veneer of plausibility. Plants are teleologically organized, yet (as Mander is no doubt aware) they clearly occupy an "assignable place in the spatio-temporal causal matrix". This is clear because they are material and physiological, even if they may not be identical to anything described in the idiom of physics. Plants are also natural, one reason not to give over to reductionists a conflation of naturalism with physicalism. (While he uses all three terms, Mander fails to distinguish among physicalism, materialism, and naturalism (96).) Unlike organisms, minds and ideas are not clearly material or physiological, which is why it is plausible to think they lack location. (It bears mentioning that minds have causal effects in space and time, however, also that it is more difficult to deny minds are located in time than that they are located in space.) Even if minds are not spatially located naturalism is not clearly threatened, moreover, since minds are encountered in nature through causal contact with their spatially located material substrates, paradigmatically the bodies of organisms.

Mander may be correct that ethical theory is amiss, and further that the trouble originated in the early modern period. Rather than Cartesian dualism, however, the culprit may instead be rejection of natural teleology as unscientific. In an indisputably grand event, the non-teleological physics of Galileo, Descartes, and Newton superseded the teleological physics of Aristotle. This encouraged a profound sense, still prominent today, that non-teleological explanation is the mark of modern science. This attitude is problematic, however, for intervening centuries have seen the emergence of modern teleological sciences, notably biology and psychology.[6] Philosophy, ethical theory included, is not alive enough to this fact. But it should be, in part due to Neo-Aristotelian efforts to ground ethics in biological teleology or in psychology relative to biological kind.[7]

Though some Neo-Aristotelians deny the claim, it is plausible to think (as Mander and I do) everything of worth either is or depends on a mind. But this is plausible only if we understand worth to entail generation of reasons for actions and attitudes in those with the ability to respond to reasons. So long as one is clear about the distinction, the term "value" can be limited to things of worth in this sense. But much ordinary value terminology -- not least the term "good" -- is not limited in this way. Consider: "It is good for trees to have long roots, so they can access nutrients deeper below ground." Or: "Those are good tree roots, since they are long." These licit (indeed paradigmatic) uses of value terminology involve no commitment to reasons for action. There is little reason to think values in this sense depend on minds or ideas. This in turn suggests that the best strategy for overcoming the fact-value dichotomy demands more subtlety than is found in the proposal that all reality is suffused with value because it is mental or ideal.

Mander displays no cognizance of the need to mark these distinctions with care. On the contrary he maintains that once theorists are "freed from the constraining bonds of individual or personal substance, there is no reason why the understanding of ideas as primarily a species of activity may not be extended in unrestricted fashion across the metaphysical sphere . . . Reality is, as Hegel puts it, 'the Idea which thinks itself'" (97, Mander's italics).[8] This is wild. No substance metaphysics is required to underwrite the reality of objects, entities, and states -- electrons and stars, earthquakes and hurricanes, ecosystems and animals, perceptions and beliefs -- posited by modern science. Nor is substance metaphysics needed to deny these objects, entities, or states are mental or ideal where neither science nor reflection provides strong reason to think they are.

5. In the seventh and final part Mander further gratifies his speculative impulses. In the opening paragraph of this part he remarks: "surely to anyone except the most hardened advocate of the fact-value distinction, the form and structure of reality must be thought a matter of great ethical moment" (227). Neo-Aristotelians are among the most strenuous critics of this distinction, however, and their position does not entail the structure of reality is of great ethical moment. On their view, the form and structure of life is the heart of ethics. This approach is viable because modern science has vindicated the teleology of organisms and minds. Science provides no strong reason, by contrast, to think reality as a whole is teleologically organized or otherwise pervaded with value. As occurred previously in his treatment of Neo-Kantian constructivism, Mander fails here to compare his idealism at length with a more disciplined rival, in this case Neo-Aristotelian ethics. Accordingly his proposals continue to seem drastic.

Mander appears to be a hopeless, and consequently a hopeful, romantic: "For all we may try to ourselves to deny it, or to put on a brave face about it, the supposition that reality may be fully captured by a wholly naturalistic framework is a deeply alienating perspective in which the things that matter most to us matter least in the world. It pictures the universe as a vast (if not endless) spatio-temporal matrix to which we are altogether insignificant" (249). These sentiments involve, as Bernard Williams noted of similar remarks by Bertrand Russell, "a muddle between thinking that our activities fail some test of cosmic significance, and (as contrasted with that) recognizing that there is no such test".[9] (Williams followed this by registering Frank Ramsey's quip that "he himself was much less impressed than some of his friends were by the size of the universe, perhaps because he weighed 240 pounds."[10])

Not long after we hear: "freeing mind from the threat of reduction down to the physical, options are opened up for both freedom and immortality" (250). I doubt any biological reduction of mind will succeed, still less a physical reduction.[11] Yet even if minds are not physical, there is every reason to think minds require suitable material substrates for their continued existence, and there is presently no way for our minds to exist absent the continued biological life of our bodies. Mander continues: "I wish to maintain that idealism alone is able to offer a world view that can yield genuine axiological satisfaction. It alone presents us with the sort of universe in which we may feel properly at home." (250) The selection of the term "wish" here is appropriate.

Idealist Ethics is written with a religious sensibility. This is not hidden -- throughout are scattered references to God, Jesus, the Bible, and theology -- but neither is it foregrounded. This matters because the work manifests the religionist's characteristic indulgence: its non-historical ambitions are self-described as "apologetic" (3). A view of the world, or of ethics, earns its keep by explaining things, not by cohering in its own terms. Rent is highest for views that, like idealist metaphysics, lack both antecedent plausibility and scientific vindication.

Still, it should be emphasized that Idealist Ethics performs important services. Not least is contributing to a (growing?) chorus of discontent with currently prevailing empiricist frames of discussion in ethical theory (30-32). All are not only welcome but needed in that enterprise. Also important is calling attention to the great thinkers and views of idealist ethics, many of whom are overlooked and many of which can be incorporated into theories uncaptivated by the ostentation of idealist metaphysics.

[1] See Christine Korsgaard, The Sources of Normativity (Cambridge, 1996), and Christine Korsgaard, Self-Constitution (Oxford, 2009). Mander writes that while he does not regard it as a form of constructivism, his own position "sits closer to constructivism than it does to realism, such that I would not mind so very much were it thought a variant of constructivism" (84n). His discussion of the self also contains points of contact with Kantian constructivist themes (117-121).

[2] Nicholas Rescher, Ethical Idealism (Berkeley, 1987), 115f.

[3] This theme is richly developed in Talbot Brewer, The Retrieval of Ethics (Oxford, 2009).

[4] See John Rawls, A Theory of Justice (Harvard, 1971); Rawls introduces the term "ideal theory" at 8-9, and he discusses the separateness of persons at 27-29 and 185-192.

[5] Mander cites theologian John Leslie's unlikely position that "organic unity may be found only where we have conscious mind" with apparent approbation (91, Mander's italics). Mander cites various of Leslie's works, including on this point Value and Existence (Oxford, 1979), 171-173, and Infinite Minds (Oxford, 2001), 43-49. It is a frustration of Idealist Ethics, however, that the reader is often unsure which views Mander introduces are avowed, and which are presented mainly for historical context. He must own some of these views, for he makes use of them in arguments. He must not own them all, however, for as he notes they are not mutually consistent. Since Leslie is a contemporary figure not known in philosophy, it would be odd for Mander to introduce his views without criticism if he does not endorse them. Similarly Mander presents Lotze's doubtful view that "teleology is interpretative" without significant criticism or defense (113). Here Mander cites Lotze, Microcosmus, translated by Elizabeth Hamilton and E. E. Constance Jones (Scribner and Welford, 1885). This work was originally published in German in three volumes between 1856 and 1864.

[6] For a magisterial defense of this claim see Tyler Burge, Origins of Objectivity (Oxford, 2010), especially Chapter 8.

[7] See Philippa Foot, Natural Goodness (Oxford, 2001); Richard Kraut, What Is Good and Why (Harvard, 2007); Michael Thompson, Life and Action (Harvard, 2008); and Talbot Brewer, The Retrieval of Ethics (Oxford, 2009).

[8] Mander's quotation is from Section 236 of G. W. F. Hegel, Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences Part One: Hegel's Logic (Oxford, 1975), which uses William Wallace's 1874 translation. This work was originally published in German in 1817.

[9] Bernard Williams, "The Human Prejudice", in Philosophy as a Humanistic Discipline (Princeton, 2006), 137.

[10] Ibid., 137.

[11] For sophisticated articulation and defense of such anti-reductionism see Tyler Burge, "Modest Dualism", in Cognition Through Understanding (Oxford, 2013). This essay was originally published in 2010.