Idealist Political Philosophy: Pluralism and Conflict in the Absolute Idealist Tradition

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Colin Tyler, Idealist Political Philosophy: Pluralism and Conflict in the Absolute Idealist Tradition, Continuum, 2006, 220pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 082647540X.

Reviewed by Douglas Moggach, University of Ottawa


This volume on the politics of British idealism contains revised and integrated versions of papers published by Colin Tyler since 1999, as well as new material. Against the background of Hegel's account of history and of civil society, the book examines key figures in the British Hegelian movement: T.H. Green (1836-1882), Edward Caird (1835-1908), and Bernard Bosanquet (1848-1923), with an additional brief discussion of Richard Lewis Nettleship (1846-1892). Tyler has been instrumental in publishing previously inaccessible archival material, especially by Caird, and has written extensively in the field. In this study, based in part on manuscript and newly available sources, he pursues four principal objectives. First, with reference to Hegelian accounts of freedom and interaction, he links politics and idealist philosophy, showing the latter to be, for his subjects, intensely practical, concerned with questions of personal and social development. Secondly, he traces the engagement of British idealists, especially Green, with critical political issues of their own day, arguing that these theorists represented advanced or progressive positions; Tyler vigorously contests conservative interpretations which are frequent in the literature. Thirdly, he proposes a distinction between two currents within the school, depending on the relation between the finite person and the absolute idea. While the latter is conceived in a largely Hegelian manner as the unity of rational concept and objectivity (or the ideal of perfection), what is centrally important for Tyler is the degree to which his authors retain a Kantian description of the autonomous self. The recognition of the intrinsic value of individuals as ends in themselves, or alternatively as vehicles of a higher and more encompassing species-purpose, serves as a criterion to differentiate among members of the movement. This analysis leads to a critique of Bosanquet for tending to undervalue particular subjects, a charge from which Green and Caird are shown to be exempt. Finally, Tyler argues for the continuing relevance of the British idealist tradition, in both its branches, for current debates on multiculturalism and identity. He identifies potential resources in this body of thought for a refurbished liberalism.

This is clearly a very ambitious programme, and Tyler's success in meeting his various objectives is uneven. He is at his best when he is most concrete, tracking, for example, changes and continuities in Green's views of the suffrage, and of the necessity of its extension. Green defends universal manhood suffrage on perfectionist grounds, arguing that political participation heightens the rational capacities and helps to realise the potential of citizens for self-determination, happiness, and the good life. Tyler effectively situates Green among other principal participants in the suffrage debate, Gladstone, J.S. Mill, and John Bright, and defends the thesis, against critics, that Green's position remains both radical and largely consistent even after the Liberal electoral defeat of 1874.

Less well developed are the Kantian foundations on which this account of British idealism is constructed: although they are frequently indicated, they are not fully explored. The distinctive strands in British idealism depend, as Tyler acknowledges, on their proximity to Kant, and on respect for persons as ends in themselves. The specific appropriations and critiques by these thinkers of Kant, themes on which they reflected continuously, remain under-examined in this volume. Tyler shows how the British idealists construe historical progress or perfection as the development of the rational and eudaimonic capacities of the species, a comprehensive outcome achieved not by a dogmatic (Leibnizian) pre-established harmony, but through interaction. This includes the diversification and opposition of particular interests, and also conflict, which, when appropriately bounded, can be, not a symptom of social decay, but a force for emancipation. Tyler contends that Green viewed the struggles of urban wageworkers to obtain the franchise in precisely this way. At the deeper theoretical level which sustains such views, matters are less clear. The explicit discussion of Kant in this volume is confined to his view of progress as a regulative idea for moral conduct, but his conceptions of freedom and autonomy, as the British idealists specifically read these, are introduced haphazardly. Similarly, Caird's relational logic is referred to (119), but not articulated. This is unfortunate, as a more developed theory of intersubjective relations might clarify further the differences from Bosanquet which Tyler wishes to establish, and underscore the viability of these thinkers for contemporary debates.

Yet even if relations to Kant are sketched very lightly, the philosophical claims of the book, especially as they relate to Hegel, command interest. Tyler cites Bosanquet's affirmation that 'the whole political philosophy of Kant, Hegel, and Fichte is founded on the idea of freedom as the essence of man' (6). Green, Caird, and Bosanquet essentially share a Hegelian view of self-determination, which is directive of their concrete political efforts and analyses. The exposition of this concept of freedom, and its application, form the core of the book. The central idea is the dialectic of the will, developed by Hegel and adapted by the British idealists. Here the universal capacity of free will (its ability to abstract from its environment, and to refocus within it) gives itself content and actuality by investing itself in particular aims, attachments, and historically grounded cultural values. (The extent to which voluntary choice is implicated in this process does, however, differ among the British theorists.) The will relates to its particular context at first immediately, but then with self-consciousness and critical evaluation, so that commitments are actively posited and reformulated, and not simply absorbed (29). Individuals constitute their own identity spontaneously by incorporating group values, but also assessing, contesting, and possibly transcending these  (29, 34, 36-37, 80, 115-16). For Hegel, membership in a rational modern state entails that one is "ideally a loyal and yet critical citizen of a thick living community, rather than a fully immersed subject of a historical tradition." (34) This claim should place Hegel, and consequently his British followers, firmly in the modern republican camp, against liberal instrumentalists and communitarian particularists; and Tyler occasionally maintains this conclusion. The life and dynamism of such a modern community derives from the vigour of civil society, characterised by networks of interaction in pursuit of determinate goals, by diversification of interests, and by the emergence of groups to sustain and advance these aims. In contrast to the identity and lack of differentiation believed to prevail among the citizens of the ancient Greek polis, Hegel's conception of modern society is intrinsically pluralistic. Contrary to many interpretations, it does not evoke a homogeneous ethical community. Tyler's reading contrasts strongly with older and recent construals of Hegelian holism, according to which Hegel espoused a Spinozistic theory describing individuals merely as evanescent moments of a single substance; and it is in sharp disagreement with criticisms that Hegel is committed to an overweening rationalism, which allegedly entails the suppression of contingency. Nonetheless, Hegel does not of course attribute priority to civil society (25-26). The state is the fundamental locus of loyalty, but for Tyler, the purpose of the Hegelian state is to foster a dynamic and diverse civil society, to "protect the integrity of the non-political public realm" (24) of associations; and to hinder hindrances to freedom (153). Tyler offers a somewhat minimalist account of the role of the Hegelian state (e.g. 187), but this is in line with his attempt to demonstrate Hegel's compatibility with -- indeed in crucial respects superiority to -- contemporary liberalism.

Among Tyler's objectives is to show that Bosanquet differs from Caird and Green, in that the former attributes an exclusively instrumental value to individuality, as it contributes to the manifestation of the absolute in time. Together, the British idealists conceive the absolute not as a timeless or transcendent entity, or according to orthodox doctrines of God, but as an immanent historical process, which individual consciousnesses can, in part, grasp. In achieving and living this insight into universal purposes, individuals show themselves to be 'free, creative spirits' (Green: here 62-64), or 'the growing centre of a growing circumference' (Nettleship: here 171). According to Tyler, however, what Bosanquet calls finite centres possess worth only as bearers of the absolute, the universal end of perfection, and this value can seemingly be quantified; but, on this account of Bosanquet, each person cannot claim unconditional respect as a rational and moral being. One way to frame this issue might be through reference to the broader idealist background, to the heritage of Leibniz, as well as Kant. The theoretical source of the difficulty lies in the respective debts of Green, Caird, and Bosanquet to these precursors; though Leibniz has his own distinct reasons for attributing intrinsic worth to each member of the spiritual realm of grace. Bosanquet is, in some respects, reminiscent of Leibniz: there exists a plurality of substances, each affording particular perspectives (though not merely a single perspective, 140-41) on the absolute, but the spontaneity of these substances is less a matter of free decision and self-determination than a necessary expression of their own inner natures (143). This is a decisive step back from Kant to Leibniz, and appears to be what distinguishes Bosanquet's account of freedom from that of Green and Caird; but Leibniz is mentioned only casually in the book (8), and Kant's own appearances are sporadic. A more Kantian theory of relation, deriving from Kant's own critique of Leibniz, might show how interaction is compatible with spontaneity and individuality, as individuals respond in their own specific ways to external causality. Thus they remain spontaneous and autonomous, neither being passively determined by outside causes, nor purely manifesting a fixed essence which precludes the working of any such possible cause. It would be helpful to know to what extent Caird's theory of relation, only alluded to here, draws explicitly on Kantian sources. The grounds and consequences of Green's late distancing from Hegel would also be of interest: is this in favour of a more strictly Kantian approach? This question is not addressed here; the focus on Green is largely on his electoral concerns.

A surprising absence from the volume is F.H Bradley (1846-1924), whose relations with Bosanquet, in particular, have elicited considerable discussion elsewhere. The extent to which the British idealists were engaged with economic questions also remains unclear in the present account. In describing the dialectic of state and civil society, Tyler vacillates between liberal and republican characterisations of his subjects. Though the relations between these approaches are much contested, two considerations might be pertinent in the present case: to what extent do the British idealists share classically republican concerns with economic inequality that can obstruct individual freedom and the practice of citizenship; and what functions do they ascribe to active citizenship itself? For Hegel, one facet of freedom is the foundation of property in the externalisation of the will. Tyler has discussed this question in other work in respect to Green, and here briefly in Caird, but the further consequences, as Hegel traces them in the Philosophy of Right, are not drawn. For Hegel himself, freedom is problematically limited by the contradictions existing within civil society, its polarisation of rich and poor. This process requires that the rational state address economic contradictions insofar as they impede the possibility of freedom for all; though Hegel is not sanguine about the resolution of the problem. His German progressive students like Eduard Gans make this issue central to their own political reflections, but its role among the British idealists remains unclarified. In his reading of Hegel, Tyler describes the modern dichotomy of citizen and bourgeois as a split in absolute (25-26), now borne within the single individual. Tyler calls this a tragic development, but does not recur to the idea later. Besides viewing the state as the co-ordinator of civil society associations, one also wonders whether the British idealists offered more robust accounts of modern citizenship, similar to those which Hegel's radical German followers sought to extract from his work. 

In his suggestive concluding chapter, Tyler contrasts the static and apolitical framework adopted by much of contemporary liberal thought, with the dynamic interactions described by both branches of British idealism; even Bosanquet, previously criticised for his tendency to subordinate individuals to the whole, here wins a partial vindication, in that his accounts of the real will (individual autonomy defined as ordered and consistent preferences) and the general will (intersubjectively shared conceptual and normative frameworks) encourage persons to revise their commitments and their self-consciousness, and to redefine prevailing social norms. Tyler suggests that the Hegelian distinction of reason and understanding is especially germane to these discussions, in showing how fixed determinations and views are rendered fluid by contradiction (185). The dissolving of rigid positions, which are based in the partial and one-sided enactments of the understanding, reveals other new perspectives and possible new commonalities, providing a Hegelian basis for tolerance and multicultural interaction. The process as Tyler describes it appears less tragic -- his preferred aesthetic category, involving suffering or diremption that leads to higher development -- than sublime, the constant redefinition of self and community in a ceaseless perfectionist struggle.

Difficulties and omissions noted, this study makes a valuable contribution to the retrieval of thinkers who long suffered from undue neglect. It whets the appetite for more: more on the Kantian background as these theorists themselves understood it; and more on their ideas of state and citizenship, of the logic of freedom and interaction.