Idealization and the Aims of Science

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Angela Potochnik, Idealization and the Aims of Science, University of Chicago Press, 2017, 252 pp., $45.00, ISBN 9780226507057.

Reviewed by Gregory J. Morgan, Stevens Institute of Technology


In this well-crafted book, Angela Potochnik argues that idealization is central to science and, relatedly, that science does not track truth directly but rather aims to support human cognitive and practical ends. She begins with two assumptions: (a) that science is the project of cognitively limited human beings and (b) that the world investigated by scientists is incredibly complex. From these assumptions, she argues that a science practiced by limited humans results in "widespread idealization" (2). Her theoretical approach, an outgrowth of naturalized epistemology, aims to reflect how science is actually practiced. That being said, it is not merely a descriptive approach, but a normative approach based on science practiced by limited human beings.

Potochnik begins by arguing that much of science is profitably understood as the search for causal patterns. She does not define what she means by patterns, but she does say they are regularities in phenomena themselves that admit of exceptions. They are not representations, but what our representations depict. Drawing on the work of Dennett (1991), Potochnik shows how a range of phenomena can embody a pattern in her sense and also deviate from it by a quantifiable degree. She notes that there are products of science that are not causal patterns (33). For example, the Caspar-Klug theory of viral structure -- which says the protein shell of a spherical virus will have 60T subunits where T=k2 +hk +h2 and h and k are positive integers -- is atemporal, purely compositional, and so non-causal (Morgan, 2010). Nonetheless, she claims that the reason scientists care about causal patterns is because they "are key to human insight into and influence over our world" (33). Furthermore, compositional knowledge is presumably useful in creating accurate dynamic causal models.

Because the world is complex and humans have limited cognitive abilities, Potochnik argues, idealizations are useful: they simplify the complexity. Idealizations and abstractions are often features of models that represent phenomena but ignore some variables and some interactions among the variables, as William Wimsatt pointed out many years ago. In contrast to Michael Strevens, who takes idealizations to represent only in virtue of what they eliminate, Potochnik proposes that idealizations play a positive representational role, by which she means that the idealizations represent a system as if it had a property that it does not. For example, a flat surface might be represented as if it were a perfectly frictionless plane, or a population of animals might be modeled as if it had an infinite number of members. Whether representations are successful because of similarity between the target and the representation or for pragmatic reasons -- two popular views of representation -- idealizations can still successfully represent reality, claims Potochnik. The difference between an idealization and an abstraction for her, then, is that the abstraction leaves some features of the target out, whereas the idealization represents the target as if it had some property that it does not. Idealizations, in this respect, are fictions. The interesting question then becomes, how does a fiction help us better understand causal patterns? And why are such fictions rampant and unchecked in science, as Potochnik claims? Her answer is that idealizations reflect a causal pattern and "maximize its salience to human researchers" (60). Further, removing all idealizations from science would not improve our science -- some are of "permanent scientific value." Presumably, the idea is that an idealization focuses one's attention on one aspect of a phenomenon at the expense of other aspects that are of less interest to the researcher.

With a sketch of the general account of idealization in place, Potochnik considers how well it accounts for scientific theory and practice in a number of fields: behavioral ecology, fluid dynamics, quantum physics, and climate modeling. The discussion about quantum physics is a little disappointing, as, prima facie, quantum phenomena would seem to constitute a challenge to her view since there are non-causal patterns in quantum mechanics, as the famous Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen paradox shows. Unfortunately, she does not address this challenge head on, but rather she draws upon work of Alisa Bokulich, to discuss ways in which classical idealizations can still inform QM phenomena, such as how many photons an atom can absorb when placed in a strong magnetic field. Other disciplines more easily fit into Potochik's framework: population genetics assumes infinite population sizes; ideal gases consist of point masses that do not interact, and so on. She emphasizes that despite the variety of fields of scientific research she discusses, all prominently employ idealizations, although often in different ways.

In chapter four, Potochnik argues that the ultimate aim of science is not truth, but understanding. Understanding, for her, is achieved by revealing or grasping causal patterns. She claims that an idealization can promote understanding directly, and not, as William Wimsatt and others have argued, because it leads to a truer theory. She notes that science has other non-epistemic aims, too: prediction, informing policy, explanation, education, and more. These aims are often in conflict in a particular case, so that a choice among them has to be made for the scientific enterprise to advance. For example, a set of climate models with differing assumptions might be useful for prediction, but not for understanding the mechanics of climate change (106). Despite her acceptance that idealization is rampant and unchecked, Potochnik wants to impose standards for good and poor idealizations. One such standard she calls epistemic acceptability. "A posit is epistemically acceptable when its divergence from truth is insignificant, taking into account (a) the posit's role in the representation and (b) the epistemic purpose to which the representation is put" (100). This standard can be applied to idealizations or to claims in general. The purposes of the research have a prominent role in determining epistemic acceptability. For example, assuming an infinite population of organisms might be an epistemically acceptable way to model natural selection, but not an acceptable way to model random drift. What counts as insignificant depends upon the purposes of the researcher, so that there is also a subjective side to understanding for Potochnik. Any phenomenon embodies many causal patterns and researchers in different research contexts can focus on different causal patterns found in the same phenomenon. Nonetheless, she wants to reject a purely subjective account. For understanding to be "actual" and not merely apparent, the causal pattern apparently grasped must be "real" (115). For a pattern to be real, it must be embodied in some range of phenomena. There is some tension here, as Potochnik rejects truth as an aim of science, but at the same time endorses the aim of grasping real causal patterns. Typically, realists would claim that grasping a real pattern is the same thing as grasping the truth about the pattern and a truth about the phenomena. What could it mean for us to discover a real pattern that is not true to the phenomena? Perhaps the idea is that if a pattern is not fully embodied in nature, then it can be a real pattern, but not completely true since nature consists in the sum of the pattern and the deviations from the pattern.

Potochnik addresses this tension. She says that achieving genuine understanding requires some type of and some degree of accuracy in virtue of the requirement of epistemic acceptability, but the accuracy needed might not be truth, or even approximate truth. I am not sure if she can thread the needle on this point. She claims that for some research interests we do not require truth or even approximate truth (117), but perhaps in those cases we should say that we do not require real causal patterns, either. Potochnik thinks that our current best theories are probably not true and will be significantly revised in the future, but they nonetheless contribute to human understanding and allow us to grasp real causal patterns. If she is correct, then the truth values of our current theories do not seem to matter. It also remains somewhat mysterious how our false, sometimes radically false, theories allow us to grasp real causal patterns.

Explanation is intimately associated with understanding. Potochnik follows Peter Achinstein in thinking of explanation as a communicative act. She pays attention to both the explainer and the audience, both being cognitively limited humans. On her account, to explain an explanandum E, an explanation must meet several criteria: (a) it must represent a causal pattern embodied in the phenomenon, including a causal-dependence relation and scope; (b) the causal pattern must be of "central importance" to the research program of the explainer; and (c) the representation of pattern and background assumptions must entail E (160). The entailment condition places her in the tradition of Hempel's DN model of explanation, but using causal patterns in the place of laws. To work in explanations, idealizations must be "functionally similar" to what they represent, claims Potochnik (157). For example, consider an infinite size idealization in population genetics: it will cease to be explanatory when genetic drift is significant enough so the idealization and background assumptions do not entail E.

With her framework in place, Potochnik considers the question of levels and fields in science. Because of causal complexity, there are a plethora of approaches to the study of nature, with different research programs having different assumptions and aims. Nonetheless, there can be a "coordinate unity" to science, where different approaches can be connected when they study the same causal complexity. The possibility of these connections undercuts the existence of incommensurable levels of analysis. She suggests that philosophers abandon talk of levels of organization entirely, arguing that there is unity to science, but not in the late logical positivist sense of all of science being reducible to physics. For Potochnik, the unity of science, or at least the sharing of evidence among different research programs, has to be coordinated.

The last chapter examines how Potochnik's picture of science enlightens issues of pluralism and values in science. Linking the aims of science to specific scientists and audiences, as she does, raises the possibility that specific, possibly idiosyncratic, values influence the products of science. However, she does not claim that values can influence whether a given hypothesis is true, but rather which hypotheses are chosen for study. This area is sometimes called the logic of pursuit in contrast to the logic of justification, although Potochnik does not use these terms. On the other hand, she claims that certain departures from the truth can promote understanding and that specific values might determine which departures from truth should be used. For example, in 1979, Stephen Jay Gould and Richard Lewontin argued in a famous paper that many evolutionary biologists had by default assumed that practically all biological traits could be explained using natural selection and admonished fellow biologists for not being more open to competing non-adaptationist explanations. Prima facie, this debate appears to be a dispute about which explanations of a trait are true. Gould and Lewontin argue that many biologists have a bias towards adaptationism which may not capture the actual evolutionary history of a given trait. Some traits are not adaptations, but what Gould and Lewontin call spandrels, side effects of unrelated design constraints.

Potochnik provides a different interpretation of the debate, arguing that optimality models used by adaptationists "are best seen as representing the causal role of natural selection in particular at the expense of their accuracy of other causal influences or, indeed, of specific phenomena" (202). Different research programs -- for example, evolutionary game theory and quantitative genetics -- have different research interests, seek different types of understanding, and are "not in opposition to each other" (202). However, in a particular case, surely we want to say that a trait is either an adaptation or not. If a trait is a spandrel in Gould and Lewontin's sense, then modelling it as an optimal solution to an evolutionary problem does not lead to a different type of understanding. Representing the trait "as if" it were an adaptation would lead to misunderstanding. Potochnik appreciates this type of worry; she says it is problematic when an idealization is thought to be "how the world really is" (203). Most biologists, however, would take themselves to be describing how the biological world really is. Potochnik's focus on understanding, and her downplaying of the need for truth in understanding, has the potential to allow for a form of relativism where scientists from different research programs can make incompatible claims and both correctly claim to be adding to understanding. One of her responses to the threat of relativism is to say that we must curtail the "metaphysical import" of science: "Representations with unchecked idealizations and the understanding they generate are not well suited to ground metaphysical conclusions" (207). This lack of grounding is a significant price to pay, and Potochnik's response would be unconvincing to many realists who would not discount the value of scientific truth as she does. It also does not capture the desire of scientists, from the entomologist E.O. Wilson to theoretical physicists, for unified general theories. Scientists might agree that our current understanding of nature is piecemeal and incomplete, but the hope for and social value of consilience is not captured by Potochnik's account.

In sum, this is a rich, well-argued book that articulates a coherent view of science and explicates the essential role of idealization in a world of cognitively limited people. Idealizations are found throughout science and this volume constitutes one of the best discussions of the role of idealization. Although she does not describe her view this way, if scientific realism is defined in terms of truth, as it is by Bas van Fraassen and others, Potochnik endorses a moderate form of antirealism where science is viewed as not aiming for the truth, but rather as a tool to facilitate human action and understanding in a causally complex world. On the other hand, she thinks that casual patterns are real and she does not deny the existence of an objective causal reality. In contrast to her focus on the disunity in science, her account of idealization draws together a number of areas of philosophy of science and philosophy of biology. With thinkers like Potochnik actively working, we can see that general philosophy of science is alive and well.


Bokulich, Alisa. (2008) Reexamining the quantum-classical relation: Beyond Reductionism and Pluralism, Cambridge University Press.

Dennett, Daniel C. (1991) "Real Patterns." The Journal of Philosophy 88: 27-51.

Gould, Stephen Jay, and Richard C. Lewontin. (1979) "The spandrels of San Marco and the Panglossian paradigm: a critique of the adaptationist programme." Proceedings of Royal Society London B, 205 (1161): 581-598.

Morgan, Gregory J. (2010) "Laws of biological design: a reply to John Beatty." Biology & Philosophy 25: 379-389.