Ideas, Evidence, and Method: Hume's Skepticism and Naturalism concerning Knowledge and Causation

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Graciela De Pierris, Ideas, Evidence, and Method: Hume's Skepticism and Naturalism concerning Knowledge and Causation, Oxford University Press, 2015, 318pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198716785.

Reviewed by Kevin Meeker and T. Allan Hillman, University of South Alabama


As the subtitle suggests, in this book Graciela De Pierris offers an interpretation of Hume that takes seriously both his alleged (radical) skepticism on the one hand, and his (apparent) commitment to a naturalistic methodology on the other. More specifically, she tries to show that Hume's apparent commitments to both "skepticism and naturalism -- despite the fact that they represent two conflicting viewpoints -- turn out to be two equally important and mutually complementary aspects of Hume's philosophical position" (1). The book is divided into an Introduction (largely a detailed overview of the central claims of the work) and five distinct and densely argued chapters. We will offer a brief synopsis of some of the main points of each chapter, followed by a few critical remarks.

The first chapter develops dual early modern frameworks concerning the theory of ideas. De Pierris refers to these frameworks by the somewhat cumbersome titles "the presentational-phenomenological model" [PPM] of apprehension and ultimate evidence, and "the logical-conceptual model" [LCM] of the same. The former, she argues, derives ultimately from the work of Descartes, whose framework encompasses both intellectual and sensible ideas. Though Locke operates within the same framework, he amends it by abandoning the intellectual aspect, focusing exclusively on the sensible. According to this amended version of the PPM, as we understand it, (i) the human mind is directly acquainted with ideas whose content ostensively appears before the mind, (ii) the mind immediately apprehends the features of these ideas, (iii) what is phenomenologically present to the mind is a particular entity (which is independent of any referent), and (iv) such apprehension by the mind is absent any sort of logical or a priori-rule-governed structure.

Leibniz, on the other hand, most thoroughly articulates the LCM, which holds that an idea has the very content that it has independently of ostensive presentation. The intellect utilizes embedded a priori structural forms (such as the law of non-contradiction) in order to cognize an idea as an objective, logically coherent, and permanent concept; the meaning and evidentiary value of any particular idea always assumes these logical rules as part of a holistic background. As a result, the LCM can more readily accommodate the mind's apprehension of strict universality and necessity by appeal to such structural rules, particularly in cases of demonstrative (e.g., mathematical) reasoning that takes place in a series of steps. The advocate of the PPM, by contrast, has no recourse to such rules and so must locate necessity and universality elsewhere (e.g., in memory). This modal framework opens wide an evidential gap between premises and conclusion of demonstrative reasoning, a gap Hume readily exploits in his more skeptical moments.

In Chapter Two, De Pierris turns to Hume's radicalizing adoption of the PPM. This radicalization emerges from Hume's focusing exclusively on the phenomenological contents of ideas as they are presented to the mind, abandoning any attempt to determine either their origin (in the external world?) or their ontological character (distinct from physical particulars?). These ideas -- as immediate phenomenological presentations -- perform a two-fold duty: they are the ingredients for belief formation, and they act as an evidentiary source. In any case, it is the single act of the mind in a given sensory intuition that serves as ultimate evidence. If this is correct, then chains of demonstrative reasoning can never yield genuine knowledge:

The only way to apprehend an internal relation between the initial and final ideas in the sequence is to apprehend a memory image of the initial ideas at the same time as apprehending the final idea. Yet for Hume . . . that this present image is a faithful copy of the initial ideas cannot be an instance of certain knowledge (146).

Under the assumption that demonstrative reasoning is the last stronghold of certain knowledge, skepticism would appear to result. And yet, as De Pierris will later argue at length, a commitment to the PPM will require that even inductive reasoning presupposes an evidential gap very similar to that which infects demonstrative reasoning. If so, a comprehensive radical skepticism on Hume's part will result.

In any event, the Cartesian quest for certain knowledge is a failure. At best we can attain probability. And so, in Chapter Three, De Pierris invites readers to appreciate the Humean virtues of the Newtonian inductivist method. A particularly strong aspect of this chapter concerns the significant differences between the scientific methodologies of Locke on the one hand, Newton on the other, as De Pierris teases apart the background metaphysical assumptions implicit in Locke's metaphysics. Indeed, she contends that Hume is more consistently Newtonian than Locke insofar as the former abandons the a priori theorizing associated with mechanistic hypotheses in favor of inductively deriving laws of nature from sensory phenomena without metaphysical baggage. Accordingly, we find an extensive (if controversial) discussion of the methodological differences between Newton and Locke and an account of Hume's dismissal of the mechanical philosopher's conception of physical causation as well as the demonstrative ideal in scientific methodology. Here De Pierris strengthens her case against a "Newtonian reading" of Locke and argues that, for Hume, one may consistently utilize the inductive method in scientific investigation while also realizing that there is no ultimate justification for either the method itself or the principle operative behind it, i.e., the principle of the uniformity of nature. That is, on one level Hume is normatively committed to Newtonian inductivism as a methodological device even if he recognizes that his skepticism casts ultimate doubt on this same device.

Chapter Four pivots to the nature of the causal inductive inference. Here De Pierris focuses on the controversial section 1.3.6 of Hume's Treatise ('Of the inference from the impression to the idea'), which she takes to be Hume's skeptical attack on the principle of the uniformity of nature. This principle, she argues on Hume's behalf, must be presupposed in order to ground any causal inductive inference. She takes great care in distinguishing her reading of the passage from other interpretations, which include the "deductivist skeptical interpretation", the "anti-skeptical interpretation", and the more recent "cognitive mechanism interpretation" (198). In their stead, De Pierris offers her own reading, the skeptical inductivist interpretation, which she argues follows straightforwardly from Hume's radicalized version of the PPM coupled with Hume's commitment to the Newtonian inductivist method. Given the PPM model for which she has already argued, De Pierris invites us to read T 1.3.6 as an extended argument against the possibility of justifying the principle of the uniformity of nature. Since this principle provides the evidential connection between the premises and conclusion of inductive inference, it must be justified independently of inductive probability. Unfortunately, De Pierris notes, it cannot be. And so, circularity results: the very method that Hume himself triumphs in scientific methodology -- the Newtonian inductivist method -- presupposes a principle that cannot be grounded independently of the methodology itself. Such circularity does not bother Hume, though. All it demonstrates is that there are two levels of inquiry -- one concerning philosophical reflection, and the other concerning science and ordinary experience:

The resulting doubts concerning the possibility of using either demonstrative or probable arguments to ground the uniformity principle then make it completely clear that the standpoint of Hume's radical skepticism takes place at a different level (a meta-level) from the positive embrace of Newtonian inductivism within his naturalist standpoint (237; emphasis added).

So how, precisely, are these two apparently conflicting standpoints supposed to fit together?

In Chapter Five we get the answer. The negative radical skepticism and the positive naturalism are actually mutually-reinforcing aspects of one all-embracing philosophical system. At the first-order level lies common sense and science wherein psychological mechanisms of association make it inevitable that we will form (reasonable?) beliefs on the inductive basis of our experiences. The sort of philosophical reflection leading to skepticism, though, occurs at a second-order or higher level of discourse. While some might take the position that the latter undermines the former, De Pierris thinks that Hume's approach is distinct insofar as, she argues, for Hume the normative evidential force of (inductive) claims made within ordinary life and science remains intact when one is not engaged at the meta-level of reflection. The goal of the skeptical aspect, we learn, is to do little more than keep metaphysics and especially theology in check, to curb our tendency to go beyond the realm of experience, and to remain firm in our Newtonian methodology of science. That is, to be good naturalists. Perhaps the following passage best summarizes her account:

Hume's naturalism. . . centrally includes a commitment to the Newtonian inductive method with its presumed uniformity principle. It is precisely here, on my view, that Hume's radical skepticism and naturalism collide. Nevertheless, the possibility of such a collision must be left permanently open; radical skepticism cannot be viewed merely as a preparatory stage to dispose us to embrace mitigated skepticism. For it is only by means of this collision that the most insidious temptation to appeal to the supernatural in the study of nature . . . can be successfully resisted. My understanding of Hume's dual relationship with Newton (both positive and negative) is what decisively distinguishes my approach (303).

Radical skepticism, far from being harmful, actually enables the human mind to resist the temptations of metaphysics and the dangers of religion.

Packed with interesting ideas and connections, this book has many strengths. In addition to the topics we have already mentioned, De Pierris meticulously supports provocative interpretations of the history of logic and Hume's thoughts on topics such as geometry, the distinction between natural and philosophical relations, and miracles. Because many of her main claims depend on how Hume is similar to and subtly different from his predecessors and contemporaries, she spends a judicious amount of time on many of these figures. Moreover, her comprehensive and unified reading of Hume's skepticism about inductive and causal inferences as well as demonstrative reasoning is particularly instructive, especially her forceful account of the skeptical nature of T 1.3.6 and its relationship to T 1.4. Given the diverse terrain covered, we expect many to question various details. We shall try to avoid getting bogged down in detailed debates of Humean texts or the early modern context. For even if we grant most of her nuanced views, we still have some serious reservations about her overall position, in part because she sometimes has a penchant for making broad, unsupported claims. In the remainder of this review, then, we shall try to explain why this view requires more elaboration and defense.

Despite her proclamation, quoted above, that it is "completely clear" (237) that Hume's standpoints operate on different levels, unfortunately we had a difficult time making sense of the entire framework and its level distinction. One way to explain a difficult position is to compare it to similar views. While De Pierris is often at pains to distinguish her views from other scholars (see, e.g., her discussion of T 1.3.6), she does not offer nearly as much help with regard to her "standpoint" reading of Hume. For instance, although she recognizes that Robert Fogelin also advocates a standpoint reading, she only briefly discusses his standpoint reading from a 1998 article (see 22, note 36 and 23, note 39) and curiously does not reference his more developed thoughts in his 2009 book Hume's Skeptical Crisis: A Textual Study (Oxford). Similarly, she only briefly refers to Paul Russell's 2008 book The Riddle of Hume's Treatise: Skepticism, Naturalism, and Irreligion (Oxford). More specifically, although De Pierris "became acquainted [with Russell's book] only after completing [her] analysis", she grants that his view "appears close to my own", partly because Russell "supports his interpretation with many of the same passages I quoted" (303, note 360). Nevertheless, she brushes aside the view as an unsatisfactory account of the various standpoints in Hume in one sentence. We accept that her view is different. But we are hesitant to agree that these quick remarks "decisively" distinguish her approach (303). In any event, because De Pierris insists on the uniqueness of her account, it is difficult to look to apparently similar views to answer our fundamental conceptual question.

To put the question simply, radical skepticism and naturalism are supposed to be "conflicting" standpoints (1), so much so that "they cannot be occupied simultaneously" (22). How then are they "mutually complementary" (1)? As far as we can tell, the idea is that each standpoint serves to support "Hume's dual relationship with Newton" (303) in line with viewing him as a "champion of the Enlightenment" (305). But just because the two standpoints supply (or can be used as) premises supporting a (conjunctive?) conclusion, it does not follow that the two aspects are "complementary". Take the conflicting claims There is only a King of Diamonds on the table and There is only a Queen of Hearts on the table. Both statements entail that There is a red face card on the table. But these entailment relations do not in any way support the claim that these three statements form a "complementary" system. By the same token, even if the Newtonian/naturalist standpoint and the radical skeptical standpoint can be used to argue for a particular conclusion, that does not help us to understand how two conflicting aspects can be "complementary" in any meaningful sense.

Even if it is to be expected that we would have difficulty understanding precisely how an admittedly paradoxical view is supposed to work, presumably Hume still could have advocated a view in this neighborhood. But as KarĂ¡nn Durland ("Extreme Skepticism and Commitment in the Treatise", Hume Studies 37,1 (2011): 65-98) has pointed out, there are significant textual challenges to attributing standpoint views to Hume (see especially 88). Because De Pierris has since 2001 been advocating something like this standpoint reading that frames her entire discussion in this book, and Durland raises such problems specifically against her account, we found it odd that De Pierris did not address such issues. Note that our purpose in raising these issues is not to refute the standpoint reading. Instead, our goal is to show why we are far from convinced that it is "completely clear" that Hume adopts such a level/standpoint view. For what it's worth, given our conceptual and textual problems with attributing this standpoint view to Hume, we take her arguments to provide admirably strong support for an alternative reading of Hume as a more thorough-going radical skeptic. Unfortunately, we do not have the time to substantiate that suspicion adequately here.

The last two sentences of the book raise a less important point that still illustrates the worry we have about understanding the overall framework. De Pierris writes: "Hume's psychology is not offered in the spirit of either contemporary cognitive science or contemporary naturalized epistemology. It serves the more ambitious goal of permanently securing the autonomy of the human understanding" (306). We believe that many see contemporary naturalized epistemology as a way of permanently securing the autonomy of the human understanding. So we found her attempt to distance Hume's overall view from the spirit of contemporary naturalized epistemology to be unconvincing and puzzling. Of course we could be wrong about the spirit of contemporary naturalized epistemology. But so could De Pierris. She provides no evidence that we should understand contemporary naturalized epistemology this way. More strongly, as far we could tell, unlike naturalism, contemporary naturalized epistemology is not even mentioned in the book until this penultimate sentence. And we could not even find the topic in the Index. (Speaking of the Index, unlike the rest of the book, which was pleasingly clean and relatively free from errors, the Index often mistakenly lists page numbers out of order -- see, e.g., the entries on custom, Euclid's Elements, Robert Fogelin, Christian Huygens, Louis Loeb, resemblance and standpoint.) In any event, we were unprepared for such a sweeping, unsubstantiated statement to be the closing of the book. It is difficult to discount the reference, though, because the placement suggests that the idea is important for understanding her overall project.

We have followed custom in devoting some time to critical comments. Nevertheless, we want to emphasize that overall we highly recommend this book. It will be especially important for Hume scholars. But it will also be of interest to anyone interested in early modern philosophy.