Identifying the Mind: Selected Papers of U.T. Place

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Place, U. T., Identifying the Mind: Selected Papers of U.T.Place, edited by George Graham and Elizabeth R. Valentine, Oxford University Press, 2004, 232pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195161378.

Reviewed by D. M. Armstrong, University of Sydney


These selected papers of the late U.T. Place contain much of interest. The volume begins with an intellectual autobiography that tells of an early interest in mysticism, of a Quaker heritage that led to conscientious objection in wartime, and a war-interrupted Oxford education that began with a study of social anthropology. The rather zig-zagging process ended with a Oxford degree in philosophy and psychology. From this time onward Place thought of himself, and worked, both as psychologist and philosopher. He did not, however, keep the two disciplines in two separate compartments. They interpenetrate in his thought, so that he was that relatively rare individual, a genuinely interdisciplinary thinker. But the way he came to philosophy/psychology already suggests, what is true, that he would be an idiosyncratic thinker who thought for himself and came to his own views.

The book should remove the impression that some may have that Place only wrote one philosophical paper of any importance. There is plenty of interesting material. One idea of his that I found particularly striking is that of the ’zombie-within’. Two chapters (10 and 11) introduce this notion, which arose for him as a functional interpretation of the evidence supporting the reality of ’blindsight’. He argues on this basis that there are two parallel input-output processing systems in us (and perhaps all mammals) one of which is associated with consciousness, while the other is an unconscious one, the system of the zombie within. Biologically, the system associated with consciousness has the function of dealing with inputs that are problematic in some way, and so in need of further processing. There is also to be found in the book a judicious defence of the analytic/synthetic distinction and an account of conceptual analysis, which he argues to be an empirical matter. The editors are to be congratulated on producing a book that shows the full range of Place’s work.

It has to be admitted, though, that when philosophers think of Ullin Place they think of just one paper, a paper that makes an insistent demand on the attention of any reviewer. Of this paper W.G. (Bill) Lycan says “In my considered opinion, ’Is Consciousness a Brain Process?’ was the single most important philosophy of mind article published in the 20th century … .” A big claim, but I agree with Lycan in thinking it is a justified one. The paper launched the so-called Identity Theory of mind, and thus began the return to philosophical respectability of materialist accounts of the mind.

Many philosophers of mind are under the impression that the theory was originally worked out by Smart and Place, or Place and Smart, depending upon which name comes into their heads first. This is quite wrong. Place’s paper was published three years before Smart published his own “Sensations and Brain Processes”. As young men out of Oxford they were together at the University of Adelaide in South Australia, Place having been appointed to teach psychology. There Place gradually converted Smart from the Rylean view of the mind, a view which they had both espoused as students. (Smart was a Scotsman, Place an Englishman who soon went back to England. Hence the cant term: Australian materialism.) This confusion about who first proposed the Identity Theory was not Smart’s fault in any way: he has always very handsomely noted his debt to Place, most recently in the Foreword to this collection. This ground-breaking paper was originally published in the British Journal of Psychology, which was unfortunate because it proved to be of much greater interest to philosophers. (There was probably much less hostility among the psychologists, but also a much lesser concern for the ontological issues.)

Place shared this opinion of the importance of his paper. In his will he donated his brain to the University of Adelaide. After negotiation with the Australian custom authorities, who take a dim view about bringing organic goods into the country, the bequest was honoured. The brain, together with a photo of the living man, may be seen at:

One thing that characterized the pioneering papers of Place and Smart was the limited nature of their claim. Led by Place, they put forward an identity theory for mental processes only. Place said that for cognitive and volitional concepts the Wittgenstein/Ryle analysis is “fundamentally sound”. But for consciousness, experience, sensation and mental imagery “some sort of inner process story is unavoidable”. In later papers he simplifies (without changing) his point by saying that it is only mental processes that should be identified with brain processes. For mental states such as beliefs the Rylean approach is all that is needed. They can be treated as dispositions.

This approach got swept away in the further development of the Identity Theory. The proposal was made (two persons associated with it were Australians: Brian Medlin and myself) that the theory be generalized to cover all of mentality, whether mental processes, events or states. Mental states, in particular, should be treated as states of the brain, central states as opposed to central processes. This development was rapidly accepted by Smart, and the original Place/Smart position was soon rather widely taken to be no more than a halfway house to a more satisfactory view.

But Place never budged from his original position. Some of the papers in this collection return to the point and argue that the expansion of the Identity Theory beyond mental processes was a definite mistake. He felt deeply about the issue. I am not aware that anybody has examined his arguments, so, in justice to this important thinker, it is of interest briefly to consider two papers ’Thirty Years On – Is Consciousness Still a Brain Process?’ and “The Two-Factor Theory of the Mind-Brain”, the latter written near the end of Place’s life.

In the first of these papers Place points out that it is not too difficult to suggest candidates for the brain processes that can then be identified with sensations or mental images. But if you ask for a candidate of the belief that is going to rain tomorrow “the mind quickly begins to boggle”. In general, the problem how to represent intentionalities (the propositional attitudes) by states of the brain he thinks to be an insoluble one. (He does not have an intentionalist view of perception. Presumably he would have argued that such a view would just make matters worse for the central-state materialist.) This is by no means a contemptible argument. Intentionality of the mental seems to be the last and hardest problem that materialism about the mind must face.

In the second paper Place argues that although we have some sort of privileged access to episodes of consciousness in ourselves and also our believings, wantings and intendings, the access is of two different sorts. The episodes of consciousness, he says, are events occurring inside our sensory apparatus. But we do not sense our own beliefs, desires and intentions. “We just know intuitively what they are”. This distinction of his, I think we must admit, has phenomenological force. Awareness of the contents of sensory consciousness does seem much more detailed and concrete than our awareness of our own beliefs, etc. This asymmetry is explained by his ’two-factor’ theory. The two different phenomenologies involved at least suggest two different sorts of thing.

The propositional attitudes, then, are to be seen as Rylean dispositions, presumably, in Ryle’s phrase, ’multi-track’ dispositions. But as Place was well aware, a good deal of philosophical blood concerning dispositions has flowed under the philosophical bridge since Ryle’s day. In particular, the need for some continuing truthmaker in the disposed object is now rather generally accepted (though the exact nature of this truthmaker remains hotly disputed!). Place is quite happy to say that mental dispositions have structural bases in the disposed mind/brain. But what he is not happy to say, as many have done, is that the structural basis is the disposition. Instead he begins by asserting that the structural basis causes the disposition (which must then, he argues, be wholly distinct from the disposition). The disposition in turn is the cause, given suitable conditions, of its manifestation, presumably a behavioural one.

This account of dispositions is very strange. But towards the end of the second paper, written near the end of his life, he says that further reflection has shown him a better way of conceiving of dispositions. They ought to be considered as laws (taken ontologically, not as law-statements), laws of the operation of the individual disposed thing. In particular he sees a resemblance to the ’capacities’ of the thing as in the theory developed by Nancy Cartwright. This good second thought does create, I think, a plausible enough ’two-factor’ theory of the mind. It is not my position, but it is well worth considering. If further attempts to endow brain processes and states with their own intrinsic intentionality run into the sand, then it might be desirable to go back and look at U.T.Place’s views again.