Identities and Freedom: Feminist Theory Between Power and Connection

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Allison Weir, Identities and Freedom: Feminist Theory Between Power and Connection, Oxford University Press, 2013, 176pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199936885.

Reviewed by Sonia Kruks, Oberlin College


Questions concerning the nature of identity and the desirability, or otherwise, of identity politics have long been topics of passionate debate among feminist theorists and philosophers. In this wide-ranging and critical engagement with the now voluminous scholarship on these matters, Allison Weir seeks to re-affirm the positive value for feminism of certain forms of identity politics: those in which various kinds of what she calls "identification-with" play a key role. She aims to rebut a recent and influential body of work that considers "identities" to be oppressive operations of power that ubiquitously constitute subjects by locating them within such categories as "women." Against such claims Weir wants to develop an account of how freedom arises in affirming identities and in making connections through them. "In particular," she writes, "I want to argue that the dimension of identity as identification-with has been the liberatory dimension of identity politics, and that this dimension has been overshadowed and displaced by a focus on identity as category" (62-3).

Weir develops her arguments through a method of extended and critical exegesis. Each chapter engages with one or more authors, first to parse out what Weir sees as valuable in their thinking and then to move "beyond" it in order to develop her own claims. As such, the book provides an incisive survey of a large body of feminist and other work on questions of identity, ranging from early and what are now "classic" essays on identity politics from the 1980's to recent works by Linda Zerilli and Saba Mahmood. Weir's wide-ranging and accessible overview of the literature will be useful for feminist philosophy classes, while her critiques and provocative arguments will provide food for thought for many feminist scholars, as well as for those concerned with questions of identity, subjectivity, agency, freedom, and so forth. Because the book considers so many thinkers and discusses such a variety of theoretical positions my treatment of it must be somewhat selective; other readers will surely discover further matters of great interest within its pages.

Weir begins the Introduction with the dramatic, but I think exaggerated, claim that "the spectre of the prison hangs over any affirmation of identity in contemporary social and political philosophy, as in social and political life" (1; my emphasis). Identity, she claims, is conceived as oppression, as "entrapment" and thus it is always cast as antithetical to freedom. Discussing Butler at some length, Weir argues that the apparent "paradox" of identity with which Butler and others grapple -- that it is through subjection that one becomes a subject, so that what one wishes to contest is what one is -- depends on conceptions of identity and freedom that are both overly narrow and misguidedly regarded as opposed to each other. By thinking, instead, of identities as meaningful, chosen, and relational, we may bring into being other notions of freedom, ones that do not align freedom with liberal conceptions of the self as a sovereign agent and so as antithetical to social identity. Such notions, instead, emphasize forms of connection and belonging. Here, "freedom," "identification-with," "connection," and "transformative identities" are implicated in each other.

Weir skillfully expands on her central claims in Chapter 1, "Who Are We? Modern Identities Between Taylor and Foucault." She draws from the early and middle-period work of Foucault the "suspicion" of identity as power-laden subjection and from Charles Taylor the apparently opposed "faith" that our identities may be "authentic" and meaningful. She argues that each position is too one-sided but they may be creatively brought together. If we conceive of freedom as a social practice through which, in connection with others, critique and resistance to dominant social constructions of the self become possible, then we open up possibilities for new, "transformative identities" to be created. Taylor is correct, she argues, that the answer to the question "Who am I?" is not about my location in social categories but is rather about my meaningful connections. However, these connections are more deeply social than Taylor himself acknowledges: "My freedom, then, must be social freedom: must be situated in my social connections" (37).

Weor further engages the question of "connections" in Chapter 2, "Home and Identity." The chapter, subtitled "In Memory of Iris Marion Young," centers around discussion of Young's "House and Home: Feminist Variations on a Theme" (1997). Via Young, Weir also revisits early feminist critiques of "home" as an exclusionary notion founded on (primarily white) privilege and on the "policing of borders" (45). Critics such as Bernice Johnson Reagon, Minnnie Bruce Pratt, Biddy Martin, Chandra Talpade Mohanty, and others had argued that privileged, mainly white, feminists sought "sisterhood" and a comfortable "home" in the feminist movement by excluding others who were not like them.[1] Young argued that, the validity of these criticisms notwithstanding, there are ways that "home" also denotes a domain of experience that is necessary for all human flourishing. Feminists, she accordingly urged, should not reject the value of home, but rather should demand that its benefits -- a space of personal meaning, security, and needed privacy -- be available for all and not only for the privileged few. Weir rehearses the early critiques of the dangers of "home" with some sympathy. She then discusses Young's response to them and argues that we should move beyond for-and-against arguments in order to view "home" as a locus of values that transcend such dichotomies. "Home," Weir argues, may be a site for connections in which we both accept the risks of conflict and where we may, in freedom, expand the self in "loving" relationships: "freedom is precisely the capacity to be in relationships that one desires: to love whom and what you choose to love" (57; Weir's emphasis). She argues that in creating such new political "homes" for ourselves within movements of "feminist solidarity" we also engage in creating new forms of "transformative identification with ideals, with each other, and with a feminist 'we'" (61).

As a reading of Young's essay, I think Weir's account misses its main point. Young does not see "home" as a place either of risk or of comfortable security within movements of "feminist solidarity" (although it may provide a needed anchor-point from whence to set forth into political movements). Instead, Young begins from the Heideggerian notion that "dwelling" is the human way of being in the world. We dwell in the world as embodied existences, and Young argues that "home is an extension of a person's body." Indeed, it is so integral to the self, she writes, that "a person without a home is quite literally deprived of individual existence."[2] Thus it is, above all, as a locus of personal existential meaning that Young defends the necessity of "home" against its feminist critics. The space of "home" is literally the personal, indeed private, place within which one most immediately dwells. Accordingly, it must lose its very meaning if it expanded, as Weir endeavors, to include making a "home" within identity politics (50). Even so, this chapter offers important insights into the kinds of connections that a transformative identity politics might require, and these are further extended in the next chapter.

Titled "Global Feminism and Transformative Identity Politics," chapter 3 focuses more fully on the notion of identity politics as an active "identification-with" through which, in self-critical reflection and in connection with others (including others who are different from "ourselves"), new and better feminist identities might be created. Again protesting against notions of identity that reduce "women" to merely an objective category, Weir argues that it is through our commitments and solidarities that we actively construct our identities as transformative. Here, Weir sets out the three kinds of "identification-with" that she thinks are necessary for feminism: with feminist "values and ideals;" with "ourselves" as a feminist "we;" and with particular others, including with strangers (68). Such identifications must, moreover, take place "across power divides" (79) and Weir turns to Maria Lugones's vision of empathetic "'world'-traveling" to flesh out this possibility.[3]

I greatly appreciate Weir's insistence that identities are not static givens and that they may be transformed through critical and collective practices. However, in this chapter and elsewhere, she often affirms the self-creating and freedom-affirming aspects of identity at the expense of acknowledging the very real constraints that unchosen ascriptions of identity inflict on many. In addition, Weir's invocations of "identification-with" need better to be unpacked conceptually. For "identification-with" ideals, or with a political collectivity, or with specific persons are surely quite distinct experiences. It is often unclear whether or when Weir is using the concept of identification primarily in a psychological vein (for example in its classic Freudian sense of libidinal attachment),[4] or as an affective orientation, or in a more phenomenological vein as a lived experience, or as designating a moral project that feminists ought to undertake through rational self-critique. A more thorough treatment of how intellect, embodied affect, emotion, and eroticism may, variously, sustain these diverse kinds of "identification-with" would better support her claims.[5]

Chapter 4, "Transforming Women," further elaborates Weir's critique of conceptions of women's identity as "entrapment." The heart of the chapter is an extended, critical exegesis of Linda Zerilli's,Feminism and the Abyss of Freedom.[6] Weir applauds Zerilli for emphasizing collective feminist practices as practices of freedom, but she is critical of Zerilli's Arendtian project of fully extricating such practices from the quagmire of identity debates. Re-evaluating Zerilli's discussion of the Milan Women's Collective, Weir argues that the practices of the Milan feminists do not, contra Zerilli's reading, supercede women's identity but rather transform it. Hannah Arendt's distinction, on which Zerilli builds, between "who" a person is ("the 'unique disclosure of human action'") and "what" they are ("identity, or substance") sets up a false opposition (104). Against this, Weir argues that "these acts of freedom are re-creating our identities as women -- are changing what and who women are" (105). Weir points out that there are serious costs attached to Zerilli's attempt to go beyond the identity, "women." For it is not only that this identity is, in part, constitutive of "who" we are but also that it has a positive liberatory potential. Referring to "the early radical lesbian feminist figure of the women-identified woman", a figure which she says "has been all but erased from our memory" (100), Weir argues that it points toward an ideal of freedom through identification with other women that we should continue to value. I am not as convinced as Weir that the identity, "women," has, in fact, become as devoid of positive values as she insists, but she still does feminist theory an important service in reminding us of its affirmative potentials.

The final chapter, "Feminism and the Islamic Revival," takes another cut into questions of identity and freedom by examining women in a situation that most Western feminists would regard as highly oppressive. It revolves around anthropologist Saba Mahmood's Politics of Piety: The Islamic Revival and the Feminist Subject.[7] Through her reading of Mahmood's ethnographic study of the women in the "piety" movement in the mosques of Cairo, Weir argues that we should reconceptualize freedom not as individual but as a "practice of belonging." Aligned with the Muslim Brotherhood, the women's piety movement engages its members in the study of Islam and in rigorous practices of devotion through which they aim to attain a stronger connection with god. Drawing for insight on Foucault, Mahmood argues that the pietist women demonstrate a strong capacity for agency by embracing discipline and by inhabiting Islamic norms. However she does not attribute a resistant agency to them (143). Weir challenges Mahmood's reading of her own ethnographic research, instead reading it as demonstrating the creation of new and resistant identities on the part of the women. She cites an example from the book of a woman named Abir who, through her commitment to piety, challenges the Islamic norms of wifely obedience and resists her more "modernizing" husband who does not want her to participate in such "backward" practices. Mahmood herself thinks that Abir's challenge "did not represent a break with the significatory system of Islamic norms" (cited 144) but rather was enabled by it. However, against this interpretation, Weir argues that critique and resistance do not have to involve a challenge to norms. Rather, she argues, the pietists should be understood as "reworking and renegotiating connections, and thereby renegotiating and transforming their identities" (144).

Weir's claim, that "the women in the mosque movement are engaged in the transformations of their identities and in attempts to transform Islamic society" (146), imputes to them meanings and intentions that they would not recognize as their own. Additionally, I am concerned about Weir's suggestion that the example of the piety movement demonstrates more generally "that freedom can be found in belonging to a defining community, in which one feels supported to explore and to strengthen one's relationship to one's ideals" (147). For we must surely ask also about the value of the specific ideals that are being embraced by a given community and, in particular, about the implications of these ideals for others who do not embrace them and are excluded. In the Egyptian context, such issues of inclusion and exclusion have recently moved sharply into focus with the coming to political power of the Muslim Brotherhood, followed by mass resistance to it and, now, its suppression. In the US context, I find myself wondering, rather uncomfortably, whether some might not enjoy a similar kind of "freedom in belonging" to that of the pietist women by participating in a white supremacist community or a cult.

Weir concludes by asking us to recognize that freedom takes many different forms. She is surely right, and Identities and Freedom invites us to think creatively about the many faces that freedom may take. Her core argument, that feminists should retrieve an appreciation of collective identity and ways of belonging as conducive to freedom and self-transformation, is both timely and welcome. However, we need also to think more closely about the dangers that freedom for some may pose for the freedom of others. Here, I return to the warnings against the exclusionary temptations of the comforts of "home" made by early critics of feminist "sisterhood." When Weir writes, at the conclusion to her discussion of the piety movement, that what feminism (that is, Western feminism) perhaps needs is "an ideal of freedom as the condition of being supported in our care for each other, a freedom that is the capacity to participate fully in our relationships with each other, with whom and with what we love" (p.147), I cannot help but wonder who "we" are and how this "we" is positioned in relation to those whom "we" do not "love."

That I am critical of some aspects of this book is not, however, to dismiss its significance. Very far from it, for it is ambitious in scope and its insights are manifold. That it stimulates critical questioning on my part is to say that it is profoundly engaging and provocative -- it is a book that all feminist philosophers, and many others concerned with questions concerning identity, freedom, power, and connection should read.

[1] See Bernice Johnson Reagon, "Coalition Politics: Turning the Century." In Barbara Smith, ed., Home Girls: A Black Feminist Anthology. New York: Kitchen Table: Women of Color Press, 1983; Minnie Bruce Pratt, "Identity: Skin Blood Heart." In Elly Bulkin et al, eds., Yours in Struggle: Three Feminist Perspectives on Anti-Semitism and Racism. Ithaca, NY: Firebrand Books, 1988; Biddy Martin and Chandra Mohanty, "Feminist Politics: What's Home Got to Do with It?" In Teresa de Lauretis, ed. Feminist Studies/Critical Studies. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1986.

[2] Iris Marion Young, "House and Home: Feminist Variations on a Theme" In Intersecting Voices: Dilemmas of Gender, Political Philosophy, and Policy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1997, pp. 134-164, p. 162.

[3] Maria Lugones, "Playfulness, 'world'-traveling, and loving perception." In Pilgrimages/Peregrinajes: Theorizing Coalition Against Multiple Oppressions. Lanham, Md: Rowman and Littlefield, 2003 (essay originally published in 1987).

[4] As Linda Nicholson has pointed out, historically, psychoanalytic notions of "identification" long precede those of "identity politics." See her Identity Before Identity Politics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008.

[5] I discuss women's embodied affect and emotions as potential sources of feminist identification among women in Sonia Kruks, Retrieving Experience: Subjectivity and Recognition in Feminist Politics. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 2001.

[6] Linda Zerilli, Feminism and the Abyss of Freedom. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2005.

[7] Saba Mahmood, Politics of Piety: The Islamic Revival and the Feminist Subject. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2005.