Identity and Modality

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Fraser MacBride (ed.), Identity and Modality, Oxford University Press, 2006, 288pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199285748.

Reviewed by Matti Eklund, Cornell University


This volume is a collection of essays all bearing some relation to the topics mentioned in the title, identity and modality. It grew out of a conference held at St Andrews in 2000, and judging from the volume -- which is of high quality and contains important contributions to many areas of contemporary metaphysics -- it must have been a very enjoyable conference.

Gideon Rosen ("The Limits of Contingency") and Scott Sturgeon ("Modal Infallibilism and Basic Truth") discuss foundational issues concerning metaphysical necessity.  John Divers and Jason Hagen ("The Modal Fictionalist Predicament") contribute to the literature on problems for fictionalism about possible worlds. Philip Percival ("On Realism about Chance") discusses whether there is any reason to believe in realism about chance.  Stewart Shapiro and Jukka Keränen have an exchange (with two contributions by Shapiro, one by Keränen) on ante rem structuralism in the philosophy of mathematics. Fraser MacBride ("The Julius Caesar Objection: More Problematic than Ever") provides an overview of responses to the Julius Caesar objection, again in the philosophy of mathematics. John Campbell ("Sortals and the Binding Problem") argues against the view that the use of a sortal concept is necessary for conscious attention to an object. The last two papers are on issues related to personal identity. Keith Hossack ("Vagueness and Personal Identity") discusses the source of the sense that indeterminacy of personal identity is puzzling. Eric Olson ("Is There a Bodily Criterion of Personal Identity?") discusses, as the title indicates, not whether a bodily criterion is right but whether one can formulate a criterion of bodily identity at all.

Since the essays are rather loosely connected, except in the case of the Rosen and Sturgeon papers and in the case of the Shapiro-Keränen exchange, a reviewer's task, discussing the book as a whole, is difficult. In what follows, I will simply remark briefly on the different contributions, pausing more on some that seem more central to the main themes of the volume.

Rosen argues that our notion of metaphysical necessity is confused, and as a result semantically indeterminate, in the way that "mass" as used in Newtonian physics is. The argument is, in broadest outline, as follows. When we consider what is an appropriate elucidation of our notion of metaphysical necessity and what are paradigmatic cases of being metaphysically necessary, we find that there are two possible hypotheses about the content of the notion that fit the data equally well. The 'elucidation' is that the metaphysical modalities are the unrestricted real modalities, where 'real' means alethic, non-epistemic, and sometimes substantive or synthetic. Among paradigmatic cases are fundamental claims of metaphysics. The "standard conception" of metaphysical necessity, the one we all tend to adhere to, does well in accommodating the paradigmatic instances. But consider, Rosen says, a "non-standard conception" which ties possibility to ideal conceivability (where 'ideal' means maximally informed, to get around Kripke's cases of aposteriori necessity). On the non-standard conception, fundamental claims of metaphysics end up being contingent. The non-standard conception, being more liberal -- less restricted -- than the standard conception, better satisfies the informal elucidation. Rosen thinks there are concepts of necessity corresponding to both conceptions, and that the notion of necessity we ordinarily employ is indeterminate or ambiguous between them.

Rosen's reasoning can be criticized. Just because there are arguments in favor of each claim about the content of the notion of metaphysical necessity does not mean that it is strictly a tie: it just means that deciding the issue is really difficult. However, even if Rosen's argument fails, the discussion might illustrate something quite significant. It can still be taken to show that there are two different necessity-like notions, so to speak, and even if one of them is, determinately, the notion that we ordinarily use, one can ask the following 'metaquestion': what justifies our focusing on one rather than another of these necessity-like notions? Can any theoretical reasons for a preference be marshaled? These questions, whatever their answers, are non-trivial even if Rosen's indeterminacy claim is not true.  (It could for instance be that the "non-standard conception", although fitting our actual use less well, is the notion that is theoretically preferable to use.)

Scott Sturgeon -- in an article inspired by his reply to Rosen at the conference -- discusses the following problem. The existence of Kripkean aposteriori necessities shows that not all propositions that cannot be ruled out by apriori reflection are possible. But might there be some refinement of the view that Kripke refuted that might be defensible? Sturgeon's conclusions are negative and he attributes the tendency to think that there must be some defensible refinement of the view to what he calls the "ep-&-met tendency": our tendency to fuse epistemic and metaphysical matters. If we should be realists about modality, as Sturgeon assumes, then there is no reason why there should be an exceptionless non-trivial epistemic criterion for when something is possible. It should be noted that Sturgeon's remarks are of potential relevance for the evaluation of what Rosen calls the non-standard conception of necessity, given which there is such a non-trivial epistemic criterion.

John Divers and Jason Hagen's article is a valuable contribution to the growing literature on two important problems for modal fictionalism, the so-called Brock-Rosen objection, to the effect that the fictionalist is after all committed to possible worlds, and Bob Hale's related dilemma for modal fictionalism.

Philip Percival argues against realism about chance. He argues that one cannot justify realism about chance by appeal to an inference to the best explanation, and he argues against various analyses of chance that would motivate realism, focusing on David Lewis's "best system" analysis.

Much of the exchange between Jukka Keränen and Stewart Shapiro concerns an objection Keränen has earlier raised against Shapiro's form of structuralism, ante rem structuralism, a version of structuralism that isn't simply eliminativist about mathematical objects but sees these objects as somehow determined by their structural properties. Keränen's argument runs as follows, as presented in his contribution to the present volume. (1) Any satisfactory ontological theory must provide an "account of identity" for the objects it is concerned with: an informative way of completing the blank in the schema,

(IS)  xy (x=y ↔ _____)

(2) The structuralist can only appeal to intra-structural relational properties in her account. Specifically, she must fill in the blank in (IS) as follows:

(STR) xy (x=y ∀φ(φΦ (φ(x) φ(y)))

where φ ranges over relational properties and Φ is a set of relational properties making no explicit reference to specific mathematical objects.

Shapiro's reply, in both his contributions, focuses primarily on the first step of the argument. Is an account of identity, in Keränen's sense, really required? To say that such an account is required is, Shapiro insists, to assume the identity of indiscernibles, and one can legitimately deny this principle.

One might well think that much of this discussion is beside the point, except perhaps in an ad hominem argument against Keränen. For, the thought would go, even if an account of identity is not always required, pace Keränen, the characteristic thesis of ante rem structuralism is precisely an account of identity: it is through its adherence to the view that the identities of mathematical objects are somehow determined by their occupying certain positions in structures that ante rem structuralism amounts to a position distinct from orthodox platonism.

Shapiro, however, insists that structuralism only entails something about which properties of an object are fundamental, but it is silent on whether sharing all these fundamental properties entails identity or not. In other words, structuralism only entails that if two objects share all their structural properties then they share all their properties, simpliciter, but two objects can share all their properties without being identical.

Keränen notes this reply, though he takes the reply to in effect postulate haecceities (individual essences). Keränen's response is that if the structuralist allows that objects can share all their properties without being identical, her thesis doesn't escape Benacerraf's argument against platonism to the effect that the platonist is committed to wild referential indeterminacy. However, it is not clear that the cases are parallel. Benacerraf's argument against platonism is that it allows wild indeterminacy -- indeterminacy in reference as between very different objects -- but the structuralist under consideration would only be committed to indeterminacy in reference as between absolutely indistinguishable objects.

In his reply to Keränen's contribution, Shapiro gives voice to a different thought, one which I think fails for an interesting reason. He notes that for every structure with a linear order, Keränen's problem does not arise (given assumptions Keränen too would accept). Then he argues as follows. If T is an arbitrary structure then we can embed T into another structure with a well-ordering, <, and use this to get around the problem Keränen presses. But this is unsatisfactory, unless we can say that the places in T are identical with the corresponding structure where T is embedded. Part of Shapiro's earlier discussion (125ff) problematizes precisely this assumption.

Fraser MacBride's own contribution focuses on the so-called Julius Caesar problem. The problem comes from Frege. Frege argued that a contextual definition of 'number', such as the one that he himself considered and has become known as Hume's Principle,

(HP) the number of Fs = the number of Gs iff there are exactly as many Fs as Gs

does not suffice to determine the truth-values of sentences of the form

the number of Fs = Julius Caesar,

and hence such a contextual definition must be rejected. MacBride provides useful distinctions between epistemic, metaphysical and semantic versions of the problem and a helpful overview of possible ways out, together with compelling criticisms of the ways out being considered.

I am a bit puzzled by MacBride's way of advertising the problem. He says, "The Caesar problem demands our attention alongside other fundamental issues that ask for elucidation and justification of the basic structure of our conceptual scheme -- for example, the problem of universals or the problem of change" (175). One may be forgiven for thinking that the Caesar problem is simply a refutation of the suggestion that (HP) is sufficient as a contextual definition, and that this is of no wider significance. MacBride's discussion is solely focused with the problem of defending (HP) in light of the Julius Caesar problem, and so does not do much to dispel this impression. The only remarks in MacBride that even promise to justify his claims about the significance of the problem concern the relation between the notions of object and identity. He refers to Frege's point that "expressions that are used to refer to objects must have associated with them a class of statements … that settle identity criteria for these objects"  (175; compare also 200). This suggests what the deeper import of the Julius Caesar problem might be: that it is for some reason impossible to provide such statements in the case of terms purporting to refer to numbers. MacBride's discussion is however focused on (HP) to such an extent that although the considerations might generalize, this is not clearly shown by the arguments. One might also problematize what is and is not correct about Frege's point. One relatively weak thought is that if, say, numbers are objects, then questions about identity and distinctness amongst numbers and between numbers and other objects make sense. This thought, even if true, does not entail that there is a class of statements, conceptually prior to identity statements, that determine the truth-values of all identity statements in which terms purporting to refer to numbers occur, or even the truth-values of all such identity statements that are determinately true or determinately false. MacBride sympathetically discusses the possibility that some identity statements may simply be indeterminate in truth-value. But he does not seem to entertain the notion that there may simply fail to be a class of statements of the kind described.

John Campbell's contribution -- which, as Campbell mentions, is basically excerpted from the discussion in his book Reference and Consciousness (Oxford, OUP, 2002) -- is a criticism of 'sortalism'. Very roughly, sortalism emphasizes the use of sortal concepts in cognition. The sortalist discussions that Campbell alludes to tend to emphasize the necessity of sortal concepts for singular reference. Campbell's own discussion focuses on "conscious attention". I take it that the connecting assumption is that to consciously attend to an object, a thinker must in some sense refer to it. Campbell argues that appeal to the use of sortal concepts is not needed; instead, he appeals to how the visual system binds together different features. (In the simplest case, features found at the same location are treated as features of the same object.) What strikes me as odd about the discussion is this. One main argument for the sortalist view is that appeal to sortals is needed to explain how we can refer to one rather than another of two colocated, and perhaps only modally indistinguishable, objects. It is, to put it mildly, unclear to what extent Campbell's alternative solution can help in this case. On the other hand, perhaps Campbell can argue that the ability to make purely modal distinctions is unnecessary for the ability to refer.

Keith Hossack discusses the problem, stressed by Bernard Williams, that from a third-person perspective it seems clear that personal identity can be indeterminate but from a first-person perspective this is impossible. Hossack's dissolution of the problem relies on the supposed fact that the (so-called) first-person perspective is Lichtenbergian: mere consciousness cannot inform me of the existence of a self. The suggestion is very interesting. But Hossack does not do much to justify the crucial, Lichtenbergian claim. Instead, much of the discussion is devoted to how, given the truth of the Lichtenbergian claim, one can still acquire a concept of self.

Eric Olson discusses in his contribution what an acceptable criterion of bodily identity -- such as that presupposed by bodily criteria of personal identity -- might be. After a compelling discussion where he criticizes suggestions that have been offered, he suggests that the reason no satisfactory criterion has been found is that there is none, even in principle: for although we speak of bodies, it is as misguided to reify bodies as (on many views on minds) to reify minds. There is of course a more flat-footed diagnosis. It is that we have found no criterion of bodily identity because criteria of identity are generally very hard to find. It is not as if the search for criteria of identity has a terribly impressive track record.

In my discussions of the individual contributions, I have tended, as is usual, to focus on what I find problematic. But all in all, this is an impressive volume, of significant interest to anyone who wants to stay abreast of developments in contemporary metaphysics.