Identity in Physics: A Historical, Philosophical, and Formal Analysis

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Steven French and Décio Krause, Identity in Physics: A Historical, Philosophical, and Formal Analysis, Oxford University Press, 2006, 448pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199278245.

Reviewed by James Ladyman, University of Bristol


One of the bold claims of this important book is that the law of identity, for all x (x=x), does not hold universally. In particular, French and Krause argue that quantum objects are not individuals, in the sense that they need not satisfy the law of identity, and yet may still be regarded as existent objects in the domain of the existential and universal quantifiers. One could be forgiven for thinking that the law of identity is so fundamental that no interesting formal logic or mathematics could be possible without it, but one would be wrong. French and Krause show how to build a (highly non-trivial) 'non-reflexive quantum logic' with a semantics based on Quasi-Set theory. Hence, the law of identity, like the law of the excluded middle and the law of non-contradiction, is shown to be, at least in principle, dispensable; it seems that none of the three most fundamental principles of classical logic is sacrosanct. While others, such as Jonathan Lowe, have also suggested that there are objects that are not individuals, the authors are the first to spell out a theory of such objects in detail. They then use it to provide a formal foundation for the phenomena from physics that seem to demand some such radical revision of classical intuitions about identity and individuality.

The book begins with an overview of the relevant philosophical concepts. The most important of which are those of individuality, distinguishability, and identity over time. The most fundamental issue in this domain is whether there is a principle of individuation for physical individuals -- an answer to the question 'in virtue of what is each physical individual the individual it is and not any other? -- and if so what it is. Some philosophers are suspicious of talk of principles of individuation. However, the essential problem can be rephrased as follows: what accounts for facts about the identity and diversity of individuals? There are two fundamentally different kinds of principles of individuation:

(a) Individuality is conferred by the bundle of qualitative properties that the entity instantiates.

(b) Individuality is conferred by something transcending ordinary qualitative properties such as a haecceity, primitive thisness or by the substance of which the entity is composed.

Of course (a) is preferred by empiricists, and, in so far as they adhere to the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, for them the question of what confers individuality and the question of what confers distinguishability are the same question. The former principle plays a crucial role in the narrative of this book since its perceived violation by quantum particles leads to the central dilemma concerning their individuality: are they individuated by some empirically transcendent feature of reality, or are they not individuals at all?

Before the discussion of quantum particles, Chapter 2 reviews the history of individuality in classical physics, and argues that it is expressed formally in the counting of states in the construction of the Maxwell-Boltzman statistics that underpin thermodynamics in the theory of classical statistical mechanics. The idea is, roughly, since classical particles are individuals, all permutations of a given state of many particles count as additional states even if they are qualitatively the same. For example, the state in which particle a is in state 1 and particle b is in state 2 is different to the state in which particle b is in state 1 and particle a is in state 2, even if particles a and b are intrinsically identical and so the two states above are empirically indistinguishable. This approach to classical particles does not require violation of the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles because the principle of impenetrability can be assumed, which implies that all particles have non-overlapping spatio-temporal trajectories, and so they can be regarded as individuated by their qualitative properties. Chapter 2 also includes interesting discussions of individuality in field theories and spacetime physics (the debate about substantivalism, the identity of spacetime points and the hole argument in General Relativity has striking parallels with the debate about quantum particles).

Chapter 3 concerns the historical development of quantum statistics and the discussions about the identity and individuality of quantum particles that ensued. There is a wealth of fascinating material concerning how the latter relate to the more familiar ideas of quantum philosophy, such as wave-particle duality and complementarity, and also to group theory and field theory. The short section 3.4 is particularly recommended for the way it makes sense of Bohr and how he understood quantum physics in terms of the loss of visualisability in terms of individuals in a space and time description. French and Krause also argue that Einstein accounted for his early quantum statistics in terms of the wavelike nature of individual quanta, whereas Planck did so by appealing to non-classical correlations between the states of non-individual quanta. One way or another, the majority of those who worked on quantum (Bose-Einstein and Fermi-Dirac) statistics regarded them as compelling major revisions of the metaphysical assumptions appropriate to classical physics. The main aim of the chapter is to show how the development of quantum statistics can be understood as the construction of statistics for particles that are not individuals in the sense that permutations of them do not in general count as additional states. Hence, French and Krause call the view that quantum particles are not individuals the Received View.

In the recent literature it has been denied that quantum statistics is explained by permutation invariance, and it has been pointed out that the idea that quantum particles must obey permutation invariance and that permutation variance is implied by classical mechanics is false. In fact, distinguishable quantum particles violate permutation invariance and obey classical statistics, and permutation invariance may be invoked to solve the classical statistical Gibb's paradox concerning the entropy of mixing. French and Krause agree that there is no valid argument of the form, classical particles are individuals therefore they obey Maxwell-Boltzman statistics, that does not employ extra premises concerning how states are to be weighted probabilistically and so on. Nonetheless, they make a good case for the naturalness of the inference. Chapter 4 is devoted to careful consideration of the metaphysical underdetermination between quantum particles transcendentally individuated and violating the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, and quantum particles as non-individual objects of some kind. This is the subject of current debate between those like Simon Saunders (2006), who think that satisfaction of Quine's weak discernibility is sufficient for individuality, and who hence argue that elementary bosons are not individuals but elementary fermions are, and those like French and Krause, who think that Saunders' interpretation of quantum states in terms of irreflexive relations between objects effectively begs the question. More radical still is to insist that we ought never to have believed quantum mechanics when it told us that particles lack determinate spatio-temporal trajectories. French and Krause discuss individuality in the context of hidden variable theories, and then explain how entanglement has been understood in terms of strongly non-supervenient relations, before closing the chapter with reflections on the relationship between physics and metaphysics.

The rest of the book is devoted to articulating a theory of non-individual objects. Chapter 5 concerns the role of names in science and discusses the idea of particle labels and their relationship to possible worlds and statistics. French and Krause argue that the quaset theory of Dalla Chiara and Toraldo di Francia formally represents a metaphysics of indistinguishable individuals. Chapter 6 argues that mathematics faces an open problem of producing a set of axioms apt for describing the structure of systems of non-individuals. French and Krause take up Schrödinger's suggestion that what is required is the formal treatment of objects for which identity has no meaning, and after reviewing how identity figures in standard logic, in Chapter 7 they begin the formal construction of the mathematics of non-individuality in the form of Quasi-sets. Quasi-set theory generalizes ordinary set theory by allowing for elements of sets to which the law of identity does not apply (but urelements obeying the law of identity and hence ordinary sets are within the scope of the theory too). French and Krause develop it in detail from axioms close to those of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory with urelements, and argue for its relative consistency to the latter, as well as stating an analogue of the Axiom of Choice for it. They go on to use their novel theory as a foundation for quantum statistics, and, in Chapter 8, as a semantics for the logic of non-individuals. Finally the last chapter reviews what has been learned and reflects on how things stand in the light of quantum field theory.

There is so much to be learned from this book and so much that could be commented on by a reviewer. I shall briefly mention a few points of disagreement I have with French and Krause. First a minor quibble. On page 17 the authors identify state independent properties with intrinsic properties and state dependent properties with extrinsic properties. However this seems wrong. If a particular electron is spin up in the x-direction, this is surely an intrinsic and state dependent property. More substantively, I think the authors are wrong to characterize individuality as pertaining to a thing on its own, and distinguishability to a thing in relation to other things. Clearly, the diversity of individuals pertains to things in relation to other things, but the whole point of the tradition that denies that the identity of indiscernibles must hold is to allow that diversity need not imply distinguishability. Similarly, indistinguishability applies to a thing on its own, as well as to indistinguishable distinct individuals. It is perhaps also wrong of French and Krause to treat the idea of primitive individuality as falling under the category of transcendental individuality. Their reasoning seems to be that to regard identity as primitive is to believe in some non-qualitative property of primitive thisness or heacceity that objects possess and which confer their individuality on them. However the defender of primitive identity could argue that nothing accounts for individuation, or numerical identity and diversity, because facts about such matters are utterly primitive.

The last two complaints are related to a claim to which the authors are sympathetic but that I think should be denied, namely that transcendental individuality implies haecceitism, where the latter is roughly the thesis that worlds differing solely in virtue of the permutation of individuals are distinct (or, as it is sometimes put, that worlds may differ solely de re). This is important because haecceitism implies the denial of Leibniz equivalence (the claim that diffeomorphic models of General Relativity represent the same physical world), but the latter seems to be accepted by physicists. Similarly, haecceitism implies that we ought to count different arrangements of particles as distinct even if they are empirically indistinguishable, and so is in tension with quantum statistics. Hence, if transcendental individuality implies haecceitism then a naturalistic philosopher has very good reason to reject the former, and if he or she is also persuaded (pace Saunders) that quantum particles violate PII, then he or she ought to infer with French and Krause that they are not individuals (indeed I think this is more or less French's and Krause's reasoning). Recall that for French and Krause transcendental individuality is effectively just the idea that two objects may be distinct despite sharing all their qualitative properties. As long as we think of transcendental individuality as pertaining to a thing on its own, then worlds that differ only in virtue of two objects interchanging their properties would seem to be distinct. Whether or not transcendental individuality is grounded in individuals possessing haecceities, or regarded as primitive, if it is construed as intrinsic then objects in different possible situations must retain their individuality and haecceitism seems natural. However, French and Krause here miss another option, namely that of what John Statchel (2005) calls 'contextual individuality'. According to the latter view facts about the identity and diversity of individuals are not intrinsic. If we think of transcendental individuality as contextual rather than intrinsic, that is in terms of contextual individuality grounded in irreflexive relations (in accordance with Saunders' proposal of weak discernibility as sufficient for individuality), or in terms of primitive contextual identity, then there is no reason to think that haecceitism follows from it (see Ladyman 2007). This means that it is possible to regard quantum particles as individuals in a very thin sense. It remains a matter for further debate whether this latter view is preferable to that of French and Krause.

In contemporary philosophy metaphysics is resurgent, yet much of this work is carried out by people apparently oblivious to the relevant science. Identity in Physics is scientifically and technically sophisticated and provides a model of how metaphysics ought to be done. It is essential reading for philosophers of physics, metaphysicians and logicians interested in identity and individuality, and is highly recommended for anyone interested in the history and philosophy of physics, or non-standard approaches to logic and set theory. French and Krause are to be congratulated on producing a rich and comprehensive book worthy of careful study.



Ladyman, J. (2007). On the Identity and Diversity of Objects in a Structure. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society.

Saunders, S. (2006). Are quantum particles objects? Analysis 66: 52-63.

Stachel, J. (2005). Structural Realism and Contextual Individuality. In Y. Ben-Menahem (ed.). Hilary Putnam. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.