Idleness: A Philosophical Essay

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Brian O'Connor, Idleness: A Philosophical Essay, Princeton University Press, 2018, 203pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691167527.

Reviewed by Nichole Marie Shippen, LaGuardia Community College, City University of New York


Brian O'Connor's book brings to mind the story of a man, who, when asked, "What do you do?" answered matter-of-factly, "As little as possible." This story provides not only a philosophical antidote to Enlightenment and post-Enlightenment thinkers' surprisingly unified anti-idleness position as outlined by O'Conner, but also a form of political resistance to the mandate to work under capitalism and a rejection of the corresponding ideology of work. He convincingly demonstrates the potential of "idleness as freedom" from a philosophical point of view by disrupting the arguments against idleness through an impressive analysis of philosophers selected from German Idealism to Critical Social Theory. As O'Connor explains it, his selection process was guided by philosophers whose anti-idleness views are received as commonsensical today. In his assessment, idleness has historically and philosophically been sacrificed to uphold values prioritized by the Enlightenment such as rationality, self-constitution, maturity, and progress (2). Additionally, he argues that anti-idleness material does more harm than good by excluding the potential of idleness as an oppositional form of freedom, which he argues is otherwise tainted by teleological claims related to what makes us most realized in our humanity.

This being said, O'Connor pays considerably less attention to addressing the pre-conditions that might make idleness as freedom possible in the first place. While his refutation of what he refers to as "anti-idleness material" is necessary to resist the common sense of anti-idleness in favor of more productive Enlightenment values such as rationality, it is not sufficient insofar as it does not address the reality of structural inequality under capitalism, which most determines who can afford to be idle and who is forced to be idle (4). Further, can defining idleness though a consideration of philosophers opposed to it provide a sufficiently imaginative understanding of what idleness or "idleness as freedom" might potentially be? After all, O'Connor admits, "This book . . . proceeds mainly by way of criticism and without advocacy for the idle life," meaning he will not advocate that people adopt idleness as an alternative understanding of what it means to be free (2). As justification for proceeding in this manner, he mentions a general societal "ambivalence toward idleness," which he argues is "constitutive of much of what many of us take ourselves to be," meaning people have either been so indoctrinated or more likely internalized the productive values of Enlightenment that they remain ambivalent about whether they want to be idle at all (2). Importantly, it is an ambivalence, which O'Connor does not seem to share. As an alternative, he offers "idleness as freedom" over and against larger philosophical claims related to self-determination that involve "busyness, self-making, usefulness, and productivity" as connected to the duties of work as the source of value and social esteem (3).

At the start of the book, O'Connor examines ideas about what idleness is and is not. He primarily defines idleness as an activity guided by no particular purpose and works interchangeably between what idleness is not toward what idleness might be. As he states though, "This is not a work of genealogy, however. The focus of the analysis here is the distinctive way in which idleness comes into view in philosophy in what is broadly called the modern age" (9) defined by "individual liberty, civic society, democracy, capitalism, and reason" (9). Idleness is defined as the antithesis of the figure of Prometheus. Quoting Friedrich Schlegel's character Julius from the novel, Lucinde (1799), O'Connor writes,

Prometheus is identified as "the inventor of education and enlightenment" and also of the project, in effect, of a rational plan of life: "It's from him [Prometheus] that you inherited your inability to stay put and your need to be constantly striving. It's also for this reason that, when you have absolutely nothing else to do you foolishly feel compelled to aspire to having a personality . . . " (15)

Perhaps more succinctly, O'Connor offers Schlegel's notion of idleness as threefold:

(1) idleness defies industry, utility, and means and ends; (2) happiness is conceived as passivity rather than restless activity; and (3) idleness directs the individual away from what in more recent philosophy is called self-constitution (the task of making ourselves into integrated moral beings). (16)

Idleness is not, however, devoid of "conceptual components and judgments" meaning it is not a mindless activity (6). As O'Connor argues, "As we idle we know what we are doing, even if we have no idea of an overall end or purpose in what we do" (6). In its simplicity, idleness becomes a potential form of liberation from all the duties self and others imposed on what it means to be human whether by way of philosophy or capitalism.

The book's second half provides more concrete and potentially fruitful understandings of idleness by way of considering play as idleness by way of Herbert Marcuse and idleness as freedom as O'Connor's own distinct contribution. O'Connor asserts that play is akin to idleness in its spontaneity and freedom from the duties of being: "The question to be pursued here is whether play can, as a number of philosophers have suggested, give us a plausible picture of human action that is free from the demands for seriousness, usefulness, and self-preoccupation" (137). Further, he defines the core characteristic of idleness as "freedom from the norms that make effective modern social beings of us":

Idleness is never guided by any particular notion of an outcome or of a 'self' that is to be realized. Idle actions are spontaneous expressions of what individuals prefer to do as they act within the contexts they have chosen. Most significantly, idleness contrasts with those potentially self-defeating conceptions of life that connect freedom to self-actualization within rule-governed institutions." (137)

In perhaps his most precise description of idleness, it now becomes clear that part of the problem may be the very philosophers O'Connor chose who may unwittingly trap him in their very logic so that his imagination is limited to defining idleness by those most in opposition to it. If we are limited to defining idleness primarily by those opposed to it, it seems we are still being defined by that opposition rather than liberating idleness from its negative or mistaken connotations.

Throughout the book, but especially in the conclusion, we get a refrain of idleness as primarily defined as "freedom from," which most philosophers and political theorists would immediately equate with notions of negative freedom, or freedom from external interference. Indeed, O'Connor primarily defines idleness as freedom from external constraints as framed by philosophy and the demands of work and career, but he also includes serious consideration of internal constraints or those values we have unconsciously internalized as our own from a psychological point of view which is more akin to positive freedom or the "freedom to" develop ourselves. Here the dilemma remains for O'Connor, in that the more rigid demands of autonomy or self-rule come into play. Kant argues something along the lines of: I am most free when I give myself a law that I then obey. But O'Connor wants to hold onto autonomy found within the experience of idleness without the rigidity he identifies in more demanding forms of autonomy. Here O'Connor necessarily must delve into the relationship between necessity and freedom, but these concepts remain at the abstract level.

While O'Connor provides necessary distinctions between idleness and the related categories of leisure and laziness, he unfortunately equates leisure with its most instrumental definition in service to the enlightenment project of self-making, which is over-determined today by the conditions of the existing capitalist regime and the corresponding ideology of work (7). For example, he seems to limit his preliminary consideration of leisure to that which allows people to be even more productive once they return to work. For this reason, I remain skeptical of O'Connor's claim that idleness is more radical than leisure in that it "threatens to undermine what that model requires, namely, disciplined, goal-oriented individuals" (8). Leisure understood properly (see the Aristotelian-Marxist tradition) does much of the same work O'Connor wants idleness to do;[1] but he is correct insofar as he notes that the classical understanding of leisure as schole, or "'leisure' pursued with virtue and for virtue" (15), still retains the guiding purpose that O'Connor argues idleness escapes. Curiously, in his distinction between idleness and laziness, which he finds have much more in common, O'Conner does not refer to Paul Lafargue's "On the Right to Be Lazy" (1883), which is unfortunate given that he would have found a strong defender of idleness as freedom in Marx's son-in-law and undoubtedly been introduced to a long list of contemporary political theorists whose work on anti-work and post-work politics are very much aligned with his ideas related to idleness as freedom.[2]

Although O'Connor argues that idleness is "not only a state of not working," he argues that it is "one of the key markers" of its definition (5). In chapter 2, he offers an analysis of Hegel's and Marx's respective arguments against idleness in favor of saving labor from alienation and estrangement and toward its higher purpose as related to freedom and sociality. Yet, O'Conner seems to underplay the determinate role of capitalism in defining the values he lists as originating with the age of Enlightenment. Here a more in-depth analysis of capitalism and the ideology of work by way of André Gorz and Kathi Weeks would make concrete much of what he describes in the abstract. Capitalism is a system that needs philosophical justification and these philosophers intentionally or not provide it in their anti-idleness rhetoric. Might this anti-idleness and capitalism be similar to the elective affinity described by Max Weber as the relationship between Protestantism and capitalism? In general, a theory of power and unequal relations of power seems to be missing from O'Connor's analysis, aside from his discussion of idleness of the aristocracy, which he defines as the "freedom from laboriousness and indifference to achievement backed by an unshakable self-belief" (171).

O'Connor's book seems to exemplify the very idleness as freedom he describes, as he states on more than one occasion that he is not advocating for idleness. In a footnote, he writes, "I am sympathetic to a rejection of the idea that criticism must be constructive for the additional reason set out by [Raymond] Geuss, namely that it burdens the critic into silence" (187). However true or not true this statement might be, O'Connor relieves himself of the burden of being constructive in advocating for idleness as freedom by considering the preconditions that might make idleness as freedom a possibility for all. Perhaps he simply wants to begin by offering a way for individuals to resist anti-idleness: "Th[e] tactic is to show that idleness in certain respects more successfully fulfills the very criteria of what it means to be free than the usual moral positions that lay claim to those criteria" (171). Nevertheless, idleness as freedom is not only about ideas and individual choice. Idleness is determined by the structural and ideological demands of capitalism under which all of us are situated and few of us escape in a liberated fashion. If idleness as freedom is to be taken seriously, it must also involve a thoughtful examination of the relationship between freedom and equality or inequality.

[1] See my own contribution to theorizing leisure as a regulative ideal toward an anti-capitalist politics in Decolonizing Time: Work, Leisure and Freedom (Palgrave 2014).

[2] See Kathi Weeks, The Problem with Work Feminism, Marxism, Antiwork Politics, and Postwork Imaginaries (Duke 2011).