If Tropes

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Maurin, Anna-Sofia, If Tropes, Kluwer, 2002, 192pp, $77.00 (hbk), ISBN 140200656

Reviewed by Eric Funkhouser, University of Arkansas


Some philosophy books take a broad perspective, offering a general theory (or at least a general presentation) of some philosophical subject matter, while others take a more narrow focus on technical problems that have already been developed within that subject matter. Anna-Sofia Maurin’s book certainly is of the latter type. If one wanted to find a general introduction to the theory of tropes (abstract particulars), or a presentation of a complete trope theory, this is not the place to find it. But Maurin explicitly acknowledges this. Instead of making a case for the existence of tropes, providing individuating conditions, explaining their role in causation, etc. she focuses on two problems that arise if one assumes an ontology of only tropes (hence the title). She calls these the problem of universalisation—”how can there be anything universal when all that exists is particular?” (59)—and the problem of thing-construction—”how are we to provide for the existence of concrete objects if all that exists is abstract?” (7). Maurin’s book should be of interest to the serious student of metaphysics for the detailed exploration she gives these two questions, and two well-known regress arguments associated with them.

The book is presented in six chapters, with only the last two devoted to these two problems for a trope-only ontology. The four chapters of preparation may be a bit excessive, and not wholly necessary. In the first two chapters Maurin makes her assumptions explicit. She is assuming a world of only tropes, where these are understood as simple, abstract, and particular. The sense of ’simplicity’ is two-fold. First, Maurin claims that there are not distinct ontological grounds for the qualitativeness and particularity of tropes. This is necessary to distinguish trope theory from traditional two-category ontologies. Second, she claims that tropes are qualitatively simple. Her reasoning here is as follows.

However, the trope is qualitative without in fact ’wearing’ anything or, in other words, it is abstract without having its abstractness situated ’in’ some particular and distinct feature of its being. The abstractness of the trope simply cannot be provided with a separate ground in the trope, since if it could the simplicity of the trope would be destroyed. (21)

But this fails to convince. Why can’t tropes have qualitative parts—e.g., color-tropes have hue-parts, saturation-parts, and brightness-parts? (Maurin is non-committal on the existence of color-tropes.) This seems plausible, though the possibility would raise problems like those for thing-construction that she discusses at great length. Namely, what accounts for the unity of such qualitatively complex tropes? But other than this, her initial characterization of tropes seems appropriate and plausible.

Instead of immediately moving from this characterization to a discussion of the two regress problems, Maurin takes a detour into chapters entitled ’Metaphysics’ and ’Truth-Making’. In the former chapter Maurin maps her project along some traditional metaphysical distinctions—e.g., her project is revisionary (in Strawson’s sense) and she accepts Whitehead’s methodological constraints on speculative metaphysics. The discussion here is of natural interest, but does no work in later chapters and could be safely eliminated. In the next chapter Maurin accepts a ’truth-maker theory’—”that is, for a proposition to be true the existence, in the world, of this or that entity is required” (38). Given the prior assumption that only tropes exist, this means that for every true proposition there must be something in the world, constructed solely of tropes, that makes each of these propositions true. The problems of universalisation and thing-construction are the two difficult cases she considers. We can naturally see how they arise on the assumption of a truth-maker theory—the Chapter 4 discussion of the details of truth-maker theory and logical atomism again seems tangential to the book’s objective. For example, several pages are spent discussing how disjunctive, negative, and universally generalized propositions pose problems for truth-maker theory, but this discussion has no bearing on the development of her trope theory in Chapters 5 and 6.

The book hits its stride, however, when Maurin begins her discussion of the problem of universalisation. Following Keith Campbell, she carefully distinguishes between two questions that may not be distinguished by the believer in universals:

The A-question: What makes it true that ’a is F’?
The B-question: What makes it true that ’a and b are the same F’? (61)

For the believer in universals, the answer for both questions is the same. a is F because it instantiates the universal F; and a and b are the same F because they instantiate the very same universal. The trope theorist holds that a is F because a has an F-trope (and similarly for b). But, this does not explain why a and b are the same F. So, the trope theorist still owes an answer to the B-question—this is the particular problem of universalisation that Maurin has in mind. Further, on Maurin’s understanding of tropes as simple entities, there is no deeper answer to the A-question that explains why F-tropes are F—e.g., “To the question of what makes it true that a particular trope a1 is, say, red, we can never obtain a more informative answer than one merely asserting that it is red because it is red, or because it is what it is” (64).

Maurin explores two answers to the B-question along trope-theoretic lines: the sameness is primitive, and the sameness is grounded in resemblance. The first answer amounts to a class nominalism. While Maurin does not accept this position, she does invoke her A/B-question distinction to defend class nominalism against some objections by D.M. Armstrong. For example, Armstrong has argued against class-nominalistic responses to the A-question which hold that being a member of the set of, say, red things (or rednesses) makes something red; rather, Armstrong has claimed, something is in the set of red things because it is red. Maurin notes, correctly, that the primitivist about the B-question can accept Armstrong’s point here.

While discussing the primitivist position Maurin also repeats her claim that tropes are simple: “No trope is ’made up’ of other tropes. No tropes are ’proper parts’ of other tropes” (71). Given that this is one of her basic assumptions, it would be nice if some of the more controversial consequences of this position were acknowledged. For example, it seems to follow that there are no structural tropes. And if no tropes are ’proper parts’ of other tropes, how are we to understand mereological sums of tropes? They cannot be tropes, but (assuming no compresence-trope is present—see below) such sums are not things either.

Though defending the primitivist position against some of Armstrong’s objections, Maurin eventually rejects primitivism because of “its failure to distinguish between those classes of tropes that serve to ground universalisation and those that do not” (77). Here she is asserting her intuition that there is not a real nature corresponding to every possible class of tropes. Those with a more liberal property ontology might disagree.

The more promising proposal is that the B-question should be answered with the claim that a and b exactly resemble, where this resemblance is understood as objective and primitive (78). Maurin then considers the nature of such resemblance in great, and admirable, detail. In particular, she considers whether the exact resemblance of tropes is an internal relation or external relation. While she marks four different ways the distinction has been made in the literature, the basic idea is as follows: internal relations are guaranteed by the existence of the objects related, whereas external relations are not. Trope resemblance is an internal relation in this sense.

As tropes are nothing but their particular nature they cannot change … Consequently, if tropes a1 and a2 exactly resemble one another, it is impossible for them (these very tropes) not to be related by exact resemblance. For tropes, therefore, exact resemblance appears to be is [sic] a founded relation that is essential to the identity of its related terms. (93)

And this seems right. (She takes it as a datum that concrete particulars can change their nature. The hyper-essentialist about concrete particulars would deny that the inability to survive change is unique to tropes.)

But the nominalist’s relation of resemblance, like the universal realist’s relation of exemplification, is problematic. If resemblance is a real relation, and only tropes (and constructs of tropes) exist, then it is natural to think that resemblance itself will be a trope. But this generates a resemblance regress—the resemblance tropes themselves resemble one another and this seems to generate a new set of resemblance tropes. The process iterates, and the worry is well described by Maurin (96).

While Maurin does not favor admitting resemblances as additional tropes, she does an excellent job of giving the position a fair hearing (as with her handling of the primitivist solution earlier). While many assume that the resemblance regress is vicious, Maurin challenges this. Her challenge leads her to inquire after the very distinction between virtuous and vicious regresses. While she does not have a novel understanding of this distinction (as with the distinction between internal and external relations), she does provide a helpful list of candidates that others have proposed. In the end, Maurin remains non-committal on the nature of the vicious/virtuous regress distinction in general, and over the question of whether the resemblance regress in particular is vicious. A more definitive position would be desirable. Regardless, she does note an independent deficiency of the proposal which takes resemblances with ontological seriousness: “one would naturally prefer an account of exact resemblance that did not force one to postulate an actual infinity of exact resemblance-tropes for each pair of exactly resembling tropes” (103). Her favored account of resemblance is that resemblances are a “pseudo-addition”. Resemblance tropes are not needed to account for resemblances, because:

For two tropes to exactly resemble one another it is enough that they exist. (109)

Since there are no resemblance tropes on this proposal, there is no threat of a (vicious) trope regress.

The final chapter moves to the question of how things—like chairs and atoms—are (or can be) constructed from tropes only. She does offer some passing comments on the alternative to a trope-only construction, but in so doing she falls into a common false dilemma. Her contrast to a bundle theory is the “idea that thing-construction can be accomplished through the introduction of an underlying substratum (a ’bare particular’)” (123). But the denier of bundle theories needn’t accept bare particulars. For example, a property realist could accept that concrete things exist in roughly the sense admitted by the traditional class nominalist—where these things do not consist of bare particulars instantiating properties—while also holding that tropes exist as dependent features of these concrete things. However, this oversight can be forgiven given Maurin’s ideal of a one-category ontology.

So, what is it that unites, or bundles, things? Limiting ourselves to an ontology of tropes only, this “thing-uniter” must itself be a trope—a compresence-trope. As with exact resemblance, the question is whether compresence is an internal or external relation. But here the answer is different. The mere existence of tropes related by compresence does not guarantee that the compresence relation will hold. Those same tropes could exist (unchanged) and yet not be so related (133). This contrasts with exact resemblance, as exact resemblance is guaranteed by the very existence of exactly resembling tropes. So, the compresence relation is external—compresence-tropes are real ontological additions. For this reason, regress worries arise. Just as a compresence-trope is needed to unify two (or more) tropes into a thing, so it seems that yet another trope will be needed to unify the compresence-tropes with the tropes it unites into a thing. And so on. This is what Maurin calls the Bradleyan relation regress for compresence.

Maurin provides solid objections against those who take compresence as an internal relation (e.g., Armstrong, Husserl, and Simons). Her discussion of the distinction between generic and specific trope dependencies is especially clear and insightful. Generic dependencies are those that hold at the species (type) level. E.g., color tropes (as a species) might generically depend on extension tropes. But it doesn’t seem that the existence of a particular (specific) color-trope depends on the existence of some particular (specific) extension-trope. The defender of compresence as an internal relation needs specific dependencies of the latter variety, but Maurin convincingly argues that these dependencies are implausible.

If compresence-tropes are entities in their own right, how does Maurin propose that we avoid the relation regress? Maurin argues that additional tropes are not needed to relate compresence-tropes with their relata, because compresence-tropes necessarily relate what they relate (164). Her point generalizes for all relation-tropes—they essentially relate the specific tropes they do. If this is true, then there is no need to account for the connection between a relation-trope and its relata-tropes through yet another independent entity. This position raises a further difficulty, however. Let’s say that an apple possesses many tropes that are related by some compresence-trope. The compresence-trope unifies these other tropes into a thing—the apple. Given Maurin’s proposed solution to the relation regress, this compresence-trope cannot exist with different relata. So, when the apple appears to change (e.g., it ripens and the color changes) we no longer have the same tropes bundled, therefore we have a different compresence-trope. But is this the same apple? Surprisingly, Maurin answers “yes”—”things are such that they may persist and remain identically the same over time although changes occur along the way” (168). This is surprising because one would think that compresence-tropes are to serve one of the traditional roles assigned to substrata—accounting for persistence through time. But, on her view, sameness of compresence-trope clearly is not necessary for sameness-of-thing. Compresence-tropes make something a thing, but do not account for sameness-of-thing. In the end Maurin’s account of sameness of thing disappoints—the identity of the apple through change is only a “loose or popular identity” (168). Here we might think she has changed the subject, for this is not identity at all.

Maurin’s discussion of compresence is limited to the relation regress, and, naturally, there are other interesting questions about compresence-tropes that she does not address. But two seemed particularly relevant to me. First, if compresence-tropes are needed for thing-construction, but tropes can also exist without being “bundled”, what is the nature of collections of tropes that are just like bundles, but for lacking compresence-tropes? Second, what is the epistemology of compresence? For example, can there be a scientific investigation of compresence? Can we know when a compresence-trope is present, and if so, how?

If Tropes offers one of the most systematic treatments of the major regress problems that beset property theories. While the solutions she develops to these problems may not be completely satisfying, her presentation of available responses to these problems should make Maurin’s book of interest to the serious student of ontology.