Ignorance: A Philosophical Study

Peels Ignorance

Rik Peels, Ignorance: A Philosophical Study, Oxford University Press, 2023, 344pp., $83.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197654514

Reviewed by Alessandra Tanesini, Cardiff University


Ignorance remains a neglected topic in analytic epistemology even though its study has spawned a whole interdisciplinary field generally known as agnotology. Arguably, Rik Peels has, over the years, been leading the attempt to remedy this lamentable situation. This book is the culmination of that work since it provides his epistemology of ignorance and shows how it can be applied to a range of issues of philosophical and social importance. In what follows I supply a selective overview of the main topics addressed in the book and briefly sketch three related worries about some of the views defended in the volume. Although I am critical of Peels’ fundamental methodological assumptions, one should not take these criticisms to imply a negative judgment about the value of the book. On the contrary, I have learnt a lot from it. I also think that it will become a reference point for subsequent research on ignorance in analytic epistemology.

Broadly speaking, in this book Peels offers first an account of the nature of ignorance and details some of its varieties and notable properties (chapters 1–4 and 6). He also defends his approach by arguing that seemingly rival accounts of ignorance, as developed by scholars in the epistemology of ignorance, are not in conflict with his view (chapter 7). He expands his epistemology of ignorance to include an account of group ignorance (chapter 5) which he deploys to discuss two examples: group extremism and white ignorance (chapter 5 and 8). In subsequent chapters, after an excursus on the positive epistemic value of temporary ignorance in education (chapter 9), Peels provides a detailed account of the conditions under which ignorance excuses (chapter 10) and those under which an agent (individual or group) is blameworthy for their ignorance (chapter 11). The book concludes with an intriguing discussion of which kinds of ignorance one can attribute to oneself by means of an assertion (chapter 12).

My first worry concerns Peels’ reliance on idealising assumptions. Peels’ work is squarely within the tradition that has recently been labelled idealised or ideal theory epistemology (McKenna, 2023). That is, Peels often (but not always) assumes that epistemic agents in a state of ignorance are largely epistemically rational in their ignorance given the evidence in their possession. Further, he also largely neglects the bounded nature of human rationality owing to the limitations that are unavoidable features of human cognitive architecture. Hence, Peels does not focus his attention on motivated forms of ignorance, on implicit biases, or on prejudices that are the outcome of the bounded nature of human rationality (Begby, 2021). I suspect that Peels would disagree with this characterisation of his methodological commitments since he occasionally refers to motivated ignorance as discussed by José Medina (2013) and to identity protective cognition as studied by Dan Kahan, Donald Braman, John Gastil, Paul Slovic, and C.K. Mertz (2007).

In response, one might highlight several junctures in the volume where the idealising approach is apparent. For instance, in chapter 7, Peels considers some strategies that ill-intentioned agents might use to keep other people ignorant of some propositional truths. These strategies include: presenting people with defeaters; supplying people with alternative plausible explanations; bribing influential individuals to disseminate false or misleading information; depriving people of access to relevant evidence (Peels, 2023, 155–166).[1] These are ways in which perfectly rational agents might become or remain ignorant of a large range of truths. But, of course, there are many other ways of generating ignorance that undermine or bypass human reasoning capacities by inducing fear or fatigue or by triggering cognitive biases such as in-group favouritism, myside bias, and so forth. It is surprising that these strategies are not mentioned in the book. It is for this reason that I conclude that Peels’ account is largely restricted to cases where it is perfectly rational to be ignorant. Peels frequently mentions epistemic vices among the sources of ignorance (e.g., 41, 105, 105), but he never explores what this possibility might entail.

In his defence Peels might point out that these considerations only concern the causes of various instances of ignorance, whereas Peels’ focus is on the nature of ignorance, which he argues remains the same irrespective of how it is brought into existence. This is, for example, the criticism he raises against El Kassar’s (2018) account of ignorance. He argues that her views are not a rival to his since the focus of her discussion is on contingent rather than essential features of ignorance (147, 171–173).

Peels’ argument is plausible. However—and this is my second worry—I suspect that he needs further argumentation in its support. To see this, it is necessary to briefly sketch out Peels’ theory of the nature of ignorance. In proposing his view, Peels makes several extremely interesting points. First, he notes that ignorance is not restricted to propositional ignorance. Instead, it is possible to be ignorant of objects because one is not acquainted with them and to be practically ignorant because one lacks the requisite know how. It is, as Peels rightly remarks, a pity that some of these possibilities have received insufficient attention in some of the literature on agnotology. I should add, however, that they were not neglected in some early feminist debates on standpoint epistemology (cf., Hartsock, 1983).

Second, Peels differentiates between several varieties of propositional ignorance. Propositional ignorance, for Peels, is best thought of as the absence of true belief (this is the New View he defends here and elsewhere) rather than as the absence of knowledge (the Standard View) or the absence of knowledge or true belief stemming from a violation of an epistemic obligation (the Normative View defended by Duncan Pritchard). However, different kinds of mental states instantiate the absence of a true belief. Peels identifies six varieties: disbelief (disbelieving ignorance), suspending judgment (suspending ignorance); not having made one’s mind up (undecided ignorance); not having considered a matter, although one would immediately assent to it if one thought about it (unconsidered ignorance); not having considered a matter which one would be able to consider and about which one would need more evidence to form a belief (deep ignorance); not having considered a matter which one lacks the concepts or cognitive abilities to consider (complete ignorance). He also mentions two further varieties which are admitted by supporters of rival accounts of the nature of ignorance but not by supporters of the New View. These are: true but unwarranted belief (unwarranted ignorance) and belief that results from the violation of an obligation (ignorance that one should not have had). In addition, varieties of ignorance are a matter of degree since for example complete ignorance is a deeper form of ignorance than suspending ignorance (ch. 6). Since knowledge does not have degrees, this is one of the main respects in which ignorance is not the negative mirror image of knowledge.

Peels’ view is that ignorance is the absence of true belief in any one of its six varieties. The kind of ignorance that is discussed in the epistemology of ignorance is not different from that discussed in agnotology. It is ignorance in any of these varieties. Discussions in those fields of study do not focus on the nature of ignorance but either on the mechanisms that produce and sustain it, and/or on the effects that flow from ignorance. These are contingent features of some instances of ignorance that merit attention but are not constitutive of ignorance itself. This is why these accounts would be compatible with Peels’ New View about the nature of ignorance.

Peels’ argument for this conclusion is to my view inconclusive. He seems to assume rather than defend the view that the nature of ignorance is not that of a functional kind, so that ignorance is not to be defined in terms of some of its effects. Yet, the view that ignorance is to be understood as a functional kind has attracted some in recent literature (Martín, 2021). If this view is correct, kinds of ignorance are individuated by their characteristic effects rather than by the kinds of mental states that they involve.

Be that as it may, one may also note that several of Peels’ varieties of ignorance are individuated by their aetiology. For example, cases of deep ignorance are distinct from cases of undecided ignorance by the fact that the causal history of the second absence of belief includes an episode where deliberation on the matter was initiated but curtailed without reaching an outcome. Hence, one may wonder why, if these features of the aetiology of a state where no belief is formed demarcate varieties of ignorance, the property of being caused by (racial) bias fails to demarcate another variety of ignorance.

In response Peels might note that this approach would lead to the intractable proliferation of varieties of ignorance. Perhaps so, but he needs to justify drawing the line where he does. For instance, why not add to the six varieties ignoring ignorance which, as with unconsidered and deep ignorance, is ignorance that results from not having considered the matter but where one would not form a true belief if one were made to consider the matter despite having the necessary concepts and evidence in its favour?

I suspect that ultimately Peels’ rationale is that the six varieties he identifies constitute, when abstracting from non-evidential matters, the main ways in which one might remain in a state of ignorance whilst proportioning one’s doxastic attitudes to the evidence in one’s possession. He might even be right on this point. Nevertheless, supporters of a non-idealising epistemology might wish to argue that there are other kinds of ignorance that are not adequately represented in his account, but which deserve to be studied by epistemologists.

Ignoring ignorance might be only one possible additional variety of ignorance. Other kinds could be added especially if ignorance is defined as a functional state of individuals, groups, or even systems or structures. I hasten to add, lest my criticism is misunderstood, that I am not arguing that token instances of ignoring ignorance cannot be accommodated in Peels’ taxonomy. I presume that they could. For example, tokens of ignoring ignorance might be of the undecided variety, whilst other tokens might be examples of deep ignorance. My complaint is that the type ignoring ignorance becomes gerrymandered in the account. A similar point could be made about, for example, motivated ignorance which might be a species of ignoring ignorance. Such gerrymandering might be problematic especially if we wish to develop a concept of ignorance suited for the purposes of regulative epistemology.

A different taxonomy might also be valuable within the context of the study of white ignorance which Peels classifies as an example of group ignorance (ch. 8). My third worry concerns some aspects of Peels’ account of this phenomenon. White people, even if we think of the group as restricted to individuals for whom being white is a source of pride, are not as a whole a structured group. Some white people might be members of structured groups of white supremacists. But this sub-population of white people as a whole is at best a mere collective of individuals who share some features. Peels’ dynamic account of group ignorance is formulated in terms of groups that possess influential or operative members (119). It is true that some white people are opinion makers, but this fact alone is insufficient to show that the population of white people is a group agent. On the contrary, it is more illuminating to examine white ignorance using notions of ignorance as a varied functional kind. So understood, some white people’s white ignorance is motivated ignorance as an expression of identity protective cognition. But others’ white ignorance might be the result of ideology or even of purely structural forces. The advantage of these functional accounts is that they intuitively correctly classify some forms of ignorance of propositions whose content is unrelated to racial matters as tokens of white ignorance. These tokens would exemplify white ignorance if the reasons why those patterns of ignorance currently exist is that past tokens of the same ignorance type contributed to racial injustice, and it is that contribution that explains the existence of current tokens of that ignorance type. These accounts might be better suited to understanding the dynamics of white ignorance, yielding less cumbersome accounts than Peels’ extremely disjunctive view of these forms of ignorance (115).

I wish to conclude by highlighting Peels’ account of the conditions under which ignorance excuses, and those which make one blameworthy for one’s ignorance. In Peels’ account ignorance, provided it is blameless, is some excuse for having done something wrong when it is ignorance (1) that one has the obligation that one violated by doing wrong, or (2) that one has the ability to meet that obligation; or (3) of how to meet that obligation; or (4) if one is not in a position to have the foresight that one day one will have that obligation (ch. 10). In addition, ignorance is culpable or blameworthy if it results from culpably (that is, knowingly) violating one’s intellectual obligations which are obligations to perform belief influencing actions (ch. 11). These two chapters make extremely rewarding reading. That said, researchers who are interested in ignorance that flows from prejudice and implicit bias might find themselves in disagreement with Peels’ account of culpable ignorance since it imposes a very high bar for blameworthiness.

There is so much more in this volume that is deserving of close engagement. I have found the discussions of the different kinds of degrees of ignorance, and of the positive role that temporary ignorance might play in education especially illuminating. The study of ignorance is clearly deserving of more attention that it has received so far. This book is an important contribution to the task of ameliorating ignorance of the complexities of ignorance.


Begby, E. (2021). Prejudice: a Study in Non-Ideal Epistemology. New York: Oxford University Press.

El Kassar, N. (2018). What Ignorance Really Is. Examining the Foundations of Epistemology of Ignorance. Social Epistemology. doi:10.1080/02691728.2018.1518498

Hartsock, N. (1983). The Feminist Standpoint: Developing the Ground for a Specifically Feminist Historical Materialism. In S. G. Harding & M. B. Hintikka (Eds.), Discovering Reality (pp. 283–310). Dordrecht: Reidel.

Kahan, D. M., Braman, D., Gastil, J., Slovic, P., & Mertz, C. K. (2007). Culture and Identity-Protective Cognition: Explaining the White-Male Effect in Risk Perception. Journal of Empirical Legal Studies, 4(3), 465–505.

Martín, A. (2021). What is White Ignorance? The Philosophical Quarterly, 71(4), 864–885. doi:10.1093/pq/pqaa073

McKenna, R. (2023). Non-Ideal Epistemology. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Medina, J. (2013). The epistemology of resistance: gender and racial oppression, epistemic injustice, and resistant imaginations. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.

Peels, R. (2023). Ignorance: a philosophical study. New York, NY: Oxford University Press.

[1] All refences in this review are to this volume unless otherwise indicated.