Ignorance and Imagination: The Epistemic Origin of the Problem of Consciousness

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Daniel Stoljar, Ignorance and Imagination: The Epistemic Origin of the Problem of Consciousness, Oxford University Press, 2006, 249pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0195306589.

Reviewed by David Papineau, King's College London


The central thesis of Daniel Stoljar's book is that we are puzzled about consciousness only because we don't know enough about the non-conscious facts.  This 'epistemic view', as Stoljar terms it, has affinities with Colin McGinn's mysterianism and Bertrand Russell's neutral monism.  But Stoljar aims to show how his suggestion can be detached from the more outré commitments of these other views while retaining their explanatory power.

In this review I shall first explain how Stoljar develops his epistemic view, and then raise some difficulties.  In the end I doubt that Stoljar's strategy offers the right remedy for our puzzlement about consciousness.  But he has done the philosophy of mind a service by making the best possible case for the epistemic view. 

As Stoljar sees it, we have strong reason to think both that (a) any facts about conscious experience are metaphysically determined by non-experiential facts and (b) any facts about conscious experience are not so determined by non-experiential facts.  Unless we adopt the desperate measure of denying that there is any consciousness, we thus face a contradiction. 

Stoljar stands by thesis (a).  Modern science gives us overwhelming reason to suppose that consciousness is determined by the kind of non-experiential materials studied by science.  So he denies thesis (b).  It may seem to us that consciousness transcends the non-experiential realm, but in this we are mistaken.

So far Stoljar is in step with normal physicalism about consciousness.  Where he differs is in his explanation of why we find it so hard to deny that consciousness transcends the non-experiential realm.  This is where the ignorance comes in.  He argues that consciousness strikes us as a separate realm only because we are ignorant of the kind of non-experiential facts on which it depends.

He offers a nice fable to illustrate his thesis.  Imagine some intelligent slugs who live on a mosaic made entirely of triangular and pie-slice shaped tiles, with some of the latter arranged into circles.  Now suppose that the slug's sense organs can only detect triangles and circles, but not pie-slices.  And suppose further that the more philosophical among them rightly become convinced that circles are not part of the basic furniture of their universe -- circular facts are determined by non-circular facts.  At the same time, these slug philosophers are persuaded by their limited perceptual abilities that the only non-circular facts are triangular facts, which sure don't look like they can determine circular facts.  So the poor slugs end up convinced both (a) that the circular facts are determined by non-circular facts and (b) the circular facts are not determined by non-circular facts.

What's gone wrong, of course, is that the slugs don't know about the pie-slice tiles.  It is this ignorance that makes them think that the circular facts must transcend the non-circular facts.  If only they knew about the pie-slices, all their puzzlement would dissolve.  So also with us humans, says Stoljar -- if only we knew about the relevant non-experiential facts, consciousness would no longer seem problematic to us.  (Rather wonderfully, the dust jacket of this book features a photograph of Slug Mosaic by Marion Obar, complete with composite tile circles -- apparently Stoljar chanced on this after he had finished writing.)

As I said, Stoljar's view has affinities both with Colin McGinn's mysterianism and Bertrand Russell's neutral monism.  As McGinn tells it, not only are we ignorant of the non-experiential facts that determine experiential facts, but this ignorance is chronic.  McGinn maintains that none of the epistemological routes open to human beings could possibly yield knowledge of the relevant non-experiential facts.  Russell's neutral monism adds a positive account of the content of our ignorance.  Russell held that consciousness is determined by the categorical grounds of physical properties.  However, science cannot tell us about these categorical grounds.  Science is restricted to describing causal roles, and cannot take us beyond this to knowledge of the consciousness-determining grounds themselves.

Stoljar explores both these views in some detail.  He shows that neither has the backing of compelling arguments.  However, he does not claim that they are definitely mistaken.  Rather he argues that they are not necessary to explain our puzzlement about consciousness.  In Stoljar's view, an explanation of this puzzlement need only suppose that we are ignorant of certain consciousness-determining facts.  It only adds extra hostages to argumentative fortune to claim that this ignorance is irremediable, or that it is of categorical matters.

Stoljar bolsters his more moderate epistemic view by instancing cases from the history of science.  Descartes argued on a priori grounds that a purely physical being could not possibly use language intelligently.  C.D. Broad argued similarly that the chemical facts of this world must be metaphysically distinct from the physical facts.  In both cases, Stoljar argues, their mistake arose from simple ignorance of relevant facts.  Descartes was unfamiliar with the modern notion of computation.  Broad did not know about the quantum theory of chemical bonding.  Once the ignorance was remedied, later thinkers had no difficulty in seeing how the physical facts determined both language use and chemical bonding.  (Note how neither of these cases fits McGinn's or Russell's paradigm.  Hindsight shows that Descartes' and Broad's ignorance was certainly not irremediable; nor was it of categorical facts, given that both computation and quantum bonding are most naturally thought of in terms of causal roles.)

I turn now to objections to Stoljar's view.  I shall consider two.  First, can his epistemic view really solve the problem as he sees it?  Second, is he right to see the problem in this way in the first place?

For Stoljar, our puzzlement about consciousness stems from our mistaken conviction that facts about conscious experience are not metaphysically determined by non-experiential facts.  Stoljar attributes this conviction to the apparent conceivability of certain physical-mental dissociations -- for example, the apparent conceivability of a being who shares all our physical properties and yet does not share any of our conscious properties (a 'zombie' henceforth).  If a zombie is genuinely conceivable, holds Stoljar, then physicalism is in real trouble.  However, on his epistemic view, zombies are not really conceivable.  They only seem conceivable because of our ignorance about the full range of physical facts.  If only we were aware of all the experience-relevant physical facts, then we would discern the necessary connection between the physical facts and the conscious facts.

Stoljar is here placing strong demands on the content of our ignorance.  It must be such that, if only we knew the relevant non-experiential facts, this would render zombies inconceivable.  However, it is not clear that any non-experiential facts could play this role.  By their nature, non-experiential facts would seem to be third-personal, objective, and non-perspectival, while experiential facts are first-personal, subjective, and perspectival.  It is hard to see how knowledge of the former could automatically render the absence of the latter inconceivable.

Stoljar is of course aware of this kind of objection.  He discusses it in various guises, and makes a number of helpful points.  However, I wasn't convinced by his response to the central issue, which he addresses in terms of Thomas Nagel's notion of a 'point of view'.  Stoljar allows that non-experiential facts will be accessible from multiple points of view, and experiential facts only accessible from one.  And he accepts that this means that someone could know about the non-experiential facts without knowing about any experiential facts that they metaphysically determine.  (Imagine someone who knows about the non-experiential facts only from a point of view different from the point of view that allows access to experiential facts.)  However, this leaves it open, Stoljar insists, that anybody who does have access to both the relevant non-experiential and experiential facts will automatically see their necessary connection.

By way of an example, Stoljar considers these two claims: John is a number and John is not in pain.  Somebody who lacks the concept of pain can understand the former claim without understanding the latter.  But, even so, anybody who fully understands both claims will appreciate the necessity of the conditional if John is a number, then John is not in pain.

The general point is well-taken.  But I wasn't convinced that it got Stoljar off the hook.  Even if we stick to someone who has all the relevant concepts, there seem to be particular reasons for doubting that non-experiential knowledge can automatically render zombies inconceivable.  Frank Jackson's 'Mary' argument is relevant here.  This seems to show that a grasp of experiential claims is restricted to those who have themselves had the relevant experiences.  It's not something that you can get from book-learnin'.  Exactly what this shows about our understanding of experiential claims is a matter for further debate.  But it certainly suggests that the 'point of view' needed to understand experiential claims is sui generis.  This leaves us without any good model for understanding how physical claims could transparently necessitate claims about consciousness.  Standard scientific demonstrations that some physical state satisfies some causal role concept are not to the point.  Nor does it seem enough to cite cases like if John is a number, then John is not in pain.  These didn't help me to understand how positive experiential claims could be ensured by physical ones.

In a way, Stoljar's distancing himself from McGinn and Russell highlights this kind of worry about his view.  According to McGinn and Russell, our ignorance is of facts that are quite different from any we are familiar with.  This posited extraordinariness adds some superficial plausibility to the thought that, if only we were acquainted with those facts, all would become clear about consciousness.  But Stoljar urges that there need be nothing so special about our ignorance -- it may simply be akin to normal cases of incomplete knowledge from the history of science.  But it is then very hard to avoid wondering how knowledge of mundane scientific facts could possibly render zombies inconceivable.   

So I am not convinced that Stoljar has solved the problem that he poses.  But perhaps he is wrong to pose this problem in the first place.  This brings me to my second objection.  Let us go back to the beginning.  For Stoljar, the problem of consciousness stems from the plausibility of the anti-physicalist claim that the conscious facts are not determined by the non-experiential facts.  Now, there is no doubt that this claim is intuitively plausible, and that physicalists thus need to respond to it.  But Stoljar quickly proceeds to some much more specific assumptions:  first, that the plausibility of the anti-physicalist claim stems from the 'conceivability' of beings who share all our physical properties but not our conscious properties; and, second, that resisting the anti-physicalist claim requires us to show that such beings are not really 'conceivable'.  (Thus the epistemic view argues that we can't really conceive a zombie who shares all our physical properties, as opposed to the limited set of physical properties we currently know about; and moreover that if we did really have all the physical properties in mind then such a zombie would cease to be conceivable.)

Now, a lot here hinges on what 'conceivability' means, and I'll come back to that.   But, at first pass, surely a lot of contemporary philosophers of mind will simply reject Stoljar's assumptions about conceivability.  In particular, consider those 'a posteriori physicalists' who hold that it is always an a posteriori matter that any physical facts determine conscious facts.  Many of these will say that the mere conceivability of some situation is no reason to regard it as possible, and thus that they are under no obligation to show that the anti-physicalist scenario isn't really conceivable.

Stoljar is of course aware of this.  Given this, we might expect him to mount some principled defence of his conceivability assumptions.  But in fact he doesn't do this.  Rather he appeals to the authority of philosophical practice.  He points out that many familiar philosophical arguments move from conceivable distinctness to actual distinctness, and suggests that it would cripple philosophical method to abjure such inferences.  In this connection, he cites Putnam's 'perfect actor' argument against behaviourism (we can conceive a being who behaves exactly like me but is mentally different) and Nozick's 'experience machine' argument against hedonism (we can imagine a life of unalloyed pleasure but of very limited value).

I found this appeal to philosophical practice unconvincing.  The examples are far too particular.  It is true that behaviourism and hedonism fall victim to conceivability arguments, but that is because of special features that they do not share with normal a posteriori theses.  Behaviourism is normally formulated as an analytic thesis, so it is unsurprising that it can be defeated by claims about conceivability.  (To see this, imagine an a posteriori behaviourism defended on the grounds that same-behavers have been empirically discovered to be same-thinkers -- difficult to imagine, I agree, but clearly the mere conceivability of a perfect actor would cut no ice against this kind of behaviourism.)  Again, hedonism is a moral theory, and so it is unsurprising that it can be tested by our evaluative reactions to imagined scenarios.  Neither of these examples is therefore a good model for the assessment of claims that are non-moral and a posteriori, such as the kind of entailments posited by a posteriori physicalists.

Stoljar's disinclination to give any principled rationale for his conceivability assumptions is all the more surprising given the care he takes to distance himself from those that do offer such rationales.  So for example he insists that his arguments do not hinge on Frank Jackson's view that reference is always descriptive, or on David Chalmers' two-dimensional semantic framework, or on any similar semantic theory.  Given this, one wonders why he is so confident that the mere conceivability of zombies poses a problem for a posteriori physicalists.  Since a posteriori physicalists deny that any claims linking the physical and the conscious realms are a priori, won't they automatically hold that zombies are conceivable?  If Stoljar were armed with Jackson's or Chalmers' semantic theories, then he could argue that the conceivability of zombies has further consequences that undermine physicalism.  But without these semantic theories it's not clear what is driving the argument.

Stoljar is by no means blind to this worry. And when he does address it head on, towards the end of the book, he says something interesting.  He reconsiders the notion of conceivability, and says that in the context of zombie-style arguments we should not assume that 'conceivably not-p' means 'it is not a priori that p'.  Rather we should simply read it as saying that 'it appears possible that not-p'.

Now on this reading, the conceivability of zombies certainly does present a problem for a posteriori physicalists.  They can't simply ignore the appearance of possible physical-mind dissociations, for such possible dissociations are inconsistent with their view.  But, if this is where the zombie argument starts, there seem plenty of other options open to physicalists, apart from Stoljar's preferred strategy of arguing that the appearance at issue isn't really of zombies who share all our physical properties.  Why not simply accept that full-scale zombies do indeed appear possible to us, and then explain why this appearance should arise even though it is false?  This move isn't open to physicalists once Jackson's or Chalmers' semantic premises are granted, for these premises do imply that if proper zombies are conceivable (in the sense of not being ruled out a priori) then physicalism requires some other reading of zombie claims on which zombies are genuinely possible.  But once we move away from the semantic arguments it is not at all clear why physicalism should be forced in the direction of finding such genuine alternative possibilities.

Thus why shouldn't physicalists simply argue that the conscious mind appears possibly different from all the physical facts only because it appears actually different?  Maybe the reason zombies seem possible is just that conscious properties seem ontologically extra to physical properties -- this would certainly imply that physical and conscious properties could fail to be correlated in other possible worlds even if they always go hand-in-hand in this one.

Of course, Stoljar might reasonably respond that this merely pushes the problem back.  Why should it appear to us that conscious properties are ontologically extra to physical ones when in fact they aren't?  Still, this question too can be answered in ways that don't involve Stoljar's idea that conscious properties strike us as extra only because we don't know enough about the physical properties.  The recent literature on consciousness contains a number of suggestions that simply take the intuitive non-physicality of consciousness at face value and seek to identify the source of this intuition.

The general point is surely uncontentious.  If some philosophical thesis seems intuitively false, its defenders need to explain why it should appear so.  One option is to argue that the thesis at issue is being muddled up with some other claim which is really false.  But that's surely not the only option.  In many cases the right explanation will simply be that we have a mistaken intuition that the philosophical thesis itself is false.  After all, it is not as if humans are incapable of directly disbelieving truths, and can only go wrong by muddling them up with falsehoods.

As these last remarks will indicate, I think that Stoljar is looking in the wrong place for a solution to the problem of consciousness.  Even so, I regard Ignorance and Imagination as an extremely valuable book.  There is a great deal of contemporary interest among philosophers of mind in the epistemic solution to the problem of consciousness.  Stoljar explores this solution with care, clarity and a great deal of ingenuity.  Anybody who wants to be fully informed about the epistemic view should read this book.