Ignorance and Moral Obligation

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Michael J. Zimmerman, Ignorance and Moral Obligation, Oxford University Press, 2014, 149pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199688852.

Reviewed by Gideon Rosen, Princeton University


This lucid, tightly focused book takes up a question whose centrality for moral theory has only recently become apparent: how exactly do our moral obligations depend on what we know? The first three chapters develop a version of the view Michael Zimmerman has defended elsewhere (2008): the Prospective View, according to which our obligations are determined, not by the objective facts, and not by our subjective beliefs, but by our evidence. Much of the book is devoted to a lively defense of this view against the many objections that have been raised against it, and for the most part Zimmerman (credibly) stands his ground. At one crucial point, however, in response to a beautiful challenge due to Holly Smith (2011), Zimmerman revises his view significantly. This revision is the main theoretical innovation, and it deserves close scrutiny. Later chapters explore implications of the Prospective View, notably for the theory of moral rights.


Zimmerman's topic is "overall moral obligation" or "moral requirement". He does not analyze the notion, but he does distinguish it from others by pointing to its role in the deliberation of the morally conscientious agent. When the conscientious agent faces a practical question, she reviews her options and (consciously or not) applies a filter, excluding options from consideration when she believes she is morally obligated not to choose them. Zimmerman concedes, somewhat grudgingly, that there may be other morally inflected senses of "obligation". But he thinks there is one notion that plays this role: "the sense of 'ought' with which the morally conscientious agent is concerned" (28, my emphasis), or more exactly: the sense of "ought" in which the morally conscientious agent never does what she believes she ought not do.

How do obligations of this sort depend on what we know? According to the Objective View, they don't: our obligations are settled by the facts and pertinent moral principles, known or not. If you take my coat from the coatroom in the honest and reasonable belief that it's yours, the Objective View says (modulo plausible assumptions), that you've acted wrongly,[1] and that's not crazy. But suppose you're a doctor whose patient has an annoying non-fatal condition. You can prescribe penicillin or do nothing. In fact penicillin is a cure, but you don't know this. Given your information, it could be a cure or it could be poison. The Objective View says (modulo plausible assumptions) that you're morally obliged to prescribe the drug. You may be blameless, even virtuous, if you don't. But if you play it safe and withhold the drug, you violate an obligation.

That's counterintuitive. It sounds quite natural to say the opposite, viz., that given what you know, you're morally obliged to play it safe. But as Zimmerman notes (29), cases of this sort don't quite refute the Objective View. For if the Objective View is true and you know it, you will think: "I don't know what I ought to do, since I don't know what's best for my patient." If you then withhold the drug, as a conscientious doctor will, you won't be choosing an option you believe to be wrong. So while the Objective View pinches in these cases, its verdicts are consistent with the main constraint on the relevant notion of obligation.

The Objective View is refuted, Zimmerman thinks, by a class of cases due to Jackson (1991). In Zimmerman's version (slightly compressed):

Jill's patient has a non-trivial skin problem. She can prescribe one of three drugs, A, B, or C, or do nothing, in which case the condition will become permanent. In fact, A is a cure, C is poison, and B is a partial cure. Jill knows what will happen if she does nothing, and if she gives drug B. But her evidence leaves it totally open whether A is the cure and C the poison, or vice versa.

A conscientious doctor in Jill's predicament will give drug B, and there is a powerful inclination to say that that's what she ought to do. The proponent of the Objective View must say, to the contrary, that this would be wrong; and like his verdict in the last case, this is counterintuitive. The difference is that in this case, the Objective View must represent the conscientious agent as choosing an act she knows to be wrong. And this violates the main constraint on the relevant notion of moral obligation.

Now this is not decisive. The Objectivist might reply: "Zimmerman has mischaracterized the role of the concept of moral obligation in the deliberations of the conscientious person. The conscientious agent normally avoids what she knows to be impermissible. But that's because she's usually in a position to identify an option that would be permissible. In Jackson cases, that's not possible, and in such cases she may well choose an act she knows to be wrong for fear of choosing an impermissible act that would be worse." Still Jackson cases clearly make real trouble for the Objective View. Think how odd it would be for Jill to think as she administers benign drug B: "I know this is wrong, but . . . "


Whether these cases refute the Objective View ultimately depends on whether a better view can be formulated. In the cases we've considered, we can distinguish the act that would be objectively best in morally relevant respects from the act that would be, as Zimmerman puts it, "projectably best". For heuristic purposes, this can be understood as a form of expected value. We associate each possible outcome -- cure, mitigation, death and the status quo -- with a number that measures its morally relevant value, and each act with a probability that it will bring about each outcome. We then define expected value in the standard way and consider a view according to which we are morally obliged to maximize expected value. This sort of view yields plausible anti-Objectivist verdicts in standard cases of moral choice under risk, and in Jackson cases. Given Jill's evidence, prescribing B is certainly not the best act. But it may have the greatest expected value, in which case the View will say quite sensibly: given what Jill knows, she must give B. It would be reckless and therefore wrong to do anything else.

Zimmerman does not endorse this simple version of the Prospective View. His considered position is that one morally ought to choose one's "best bet" (37). This will often be the act that maximizes expected value. But he allows that in general the function to be maximized may be more complex than a simple weighted average, and may involve special provisions for cases in which probabilities are not forthcoming. Still, to a good first approximation, the view is that one morally ought to maximize what Zimmerman calls "projected value" (PV), where

PV (A) = Σi (pr Oi/A · value (A))

But this is just a scheme. A determinate version of the Prospective View needs an account of the relevant values and probabilities. Zimmerman aims to be neutral among substantive moral theories, so he seeks a formulation that will accommodate Kantian and virtue theoretic conceptions of "what matters morally", along with standard forms of consequentialism. But he can't be completely neutral. The approach assumes that any tenable theory can be "consequentialized", in the sense that outcomes can be assigned commensurable, morally relevant values independently of the permissibility of the acts that bring them about. Substantive theories that cannot be shoehorned into this format are incompatible with the Prospective View. And while Zimmerman does not dilate on the point, we can take his book as a challenge to any view of this sort, the challenge being to describe a position that does not assume "consequentializability" and which yields defensible verdicts in Jackson cases.

Zimmerman can defer the project of providing a substantive theory of value, but he must tell us what sort of value he has in mind, and in particular whether the values invoked by the Prospective View are constrained by what the agent knows or thinks. Suppose Achilles believes that martial glory is the summum bonum and wants to know whether it's morally permissible to drag Hector's body around the walls of Troy before returning it to his father. If the relevant values are fixed by the agent's beliefs, then this grotesque act may be projectably best, hence morally required on the Projective View. But that's untenable, so Zimmerman rejects subjectivism. However he also rejects versions of the view on which the relevant values are the real values, known nor not. The argument here moves quickly (67), but the crucial point is that there can be Jackson cases in which the agent knows the non-evaluative facts but is uncertain about the objective values. Zimmerman does not give a case, but consider:

Jill has three options for treating her patient's non-fatal condition. If she gives drug B, no important value will be infringed upon and the patient's condition will be mitigated. But she can also prepare drugs A and C, both of which will cure her patient completely. To prepare A she must kill a dog; to prepare C she must extinguish the last remaining members of an unremarkable species of lichen. Her guru tells her that one of these acts will sacrifice something of immense importance, while the other won't, but he won't say more.

If the "real values" version of the Prospective View were correct, Jill would be in a position to know that it would be wrong to prescribe drug B. And yet surely a conscientious doctor in her shoes would do just that.

Zimmerman's response invokes a notion of value that is neither objective nor subjective, but rather evidence relative. Zimmerman assumes a notion of objective evidential probability. Relative to the evidence we normally have before a coin toss, the probability of heads is ½. This is not a measure of anyone's actual credence, or of objective chance, but rather of the credence it would be rational for someone with our evidence to have. Zimmerman is clear that the probabilities that bear on the projected value of acts are probabilities of this sort (75). Moreover, it is crucial for Zimmerman's purposes that this notion of evidential probability apply not only to ordinary empirical propositions, but to propositions about the values of outcomes. With this notion in hand, we can define a notion of outcome projected value (my terminology):

OPV () = Σ­j (pr (O has value Vj· Vj)[2]

In the evaluative Jackson case, while the objective value of curing her patient with drug C (extinguishing the lichens) may be quite high, given Jill's evaluative evidence -- her background knowledge plus the testimony of her guru -- the projected value of this outcome may be low. A version of prospectivism that invokes projected value is thus well placed to give plausible answers in Jackson cases of both sorts. So to a better approximation, the view is this:

One morally ought to perform an act that maximizes projected value PV, where PV (A) = Σi (pr Oi/A · PVO (Oi)).[3]


The most straightforward version of this view -- endorsed in Zimmerman 2008 -- takes the probability of p for X to be the evidential probability of p relative to the evidence X actually possesses. One can imagine views on which the relevant probabilities are taken relative to the evidence accessible to X, or to the evidence X would have possessed if he'd done his homework. But Zimmerman insists that what matters is the agent's actual evidence. In fact he insists on a more restrictive view. The restriction is motivated by a case due to Holly Smith (2011).

Harry has three options for treating a serious non-fatal condition. He can do nothing, E, or prescribe one of two drugs, F or G. Harry knows that each option might cure the patient. But he also knows that E might lead to the loss of a foot (bad), F to the loss of the patient's left hand (worse), and G to the loss of his right hand (still worse). Harry's evidence in fact yields sharp conditional probabilities for these outcomes, but he hasn't worked them out and must decide on a course of treatment now. A reliable colleague then assures him that E will not maximize projected value relative to these (unknown-to-Harry) probabilities.

A version of the Prospective View that operates with probabilities relative to the agent's total evidence will entail that Harry ought to give (say) G, if that's the act with the greatest projected value given Harry's evidence. And yet as Zimmerman concedes: "Surely, if Harry is conscientious, he will choose option E, despite knowing in light of his colleague's testimony that doing so would not maximize projected value" (70).

Given Zimmerman's basic constraint on moral obligation -- that a conscientious agent never chooses what she believes to be wrong -- this refutes the "total evidence" version of the Prospective View. Zimmerman's response is to distinguish the evidence an agent has from the evidence of which she has availed herself (72f). On Zimmerman's considered view, the probabilities relevant to the calculation of projected value are the agent's justified credences. Unjustified beliefs don't count. But neither do beliefs that would be justified but which have not been formed. If we set these aside, what remains are the agent's actual rational credences. Where these exist, they are the input to the calculation of projected value. Where they don't, some non-probabilistic principle kicks in.


This view has a number of surprising implications:

You face an urgent choice between A and B. Before you reflect on your evidence in order to assign probabilities, you know that while A and B have the same upside potential, A could be disastrous, while B is at worst neutral. You note this and conclude -- since you must act now -- that you must do B. But then you find yourself with an extra moment, reflect, and arrive at justified credences relative to which the projected value of A is greater. (A is more likely to yield the benefit and highly unlikely to yield disaster.) So you change your mind and conclude that you must do A. It would be natural to say when you reflected you realized that your first deontic judgment was mistaken, and that reflection is valuable precisely because it gives us a clearer view of our obligations. The Prospectivist must say instead that your unreflective judgment was perfectly correct. You didn't learn more about your obligations by reflecting. Rather, as you revised your credences, your obligations shifted.

You face a choice between C and D, and given your justified credences, the projected value of C is greater. But your guru is better informed, so you ask: "What should I do?" Suppose your guru knows that C but not D will have disastrous consequences. The natural thought is that the guru only has one good answer: "You should do D." And yet Prospectivism entails that whatever your guru says will be true. If he says you should choose D, then given the justified credences you will then have, D will have the greater projected value and his answer will be true. But if he perversely tells you to do C, then given the justified credences you will then have, C will have the greater projected value, and again his answer will be true.

In an illuminating chapter, Zimmerman notes that insofar as moral rights are correlative with moral obligations, Prospectivism entails that our rights depend in surprising ways on the beliefs of others. It is bracing, though not implausible, to be told that when the prosecution, acting in good faith, makes a compelling case against an innocent defendant, the defendant has no right to an acquittal.[4] But suppose an innocent defendant is charged with a crime, and that the prosecution's case has been undermined by the defense. If the jury assesses the evidence correctly, they will be obliged to acquit and the defendant will have a correlative right to acquittal. But suppose that thanks to (say) unconscious racial bias, the jury misassesses the evidence and votes to convict. The obvious thing to say is that a defendant who has proved his innocence has the right to acquittal. A "total evidence" version of the Prospective View can say this. But Zimmerman can't. He must say instead that whether the defendant's rights have been violated turns on the obscure question whether, given the actual credences that remain when the jury's irrational credences are subtracted, a vote to acquit was projectably best. Zimmerman's view thus seems to make an easy question hard.

You borrow my book, promising to return it, and then forget completely about the transaction. Surely I still have a right against you that you return the book. But on Zimmerman's view that depends on whether you have a moral obligation to return the book, which in turn depends on whether your actual rational credences make that act best, which they may not.

Consider the Nazi doctor who experiments on prisoners in the honest belief that the misery he causes counts for nothing. The only sane thing to say about such cases is that whatever the Nazi may think, people have a right not to be treated in these ways simply in virtue of being persons, and that it is one of the great discoveries in moral history that people have always had this right. The "total evidence" version of the Prospective View can say this, provided we think that universally available evidence justifies the belief that human suffering always matters morally. Zimmerman's more subjectivist view must say instead that such rights only exist when the bearers of the corresponding duties appreciate the values that underlie them.


These cases suggest that in addition to the conception of "obligation" and "right" with which Zimmerman is concerned, we have another conception on which inquiry can disclose pre-existing obligations, and on which my rights against you are not so sensitive to what you happen to believe. Since Zimmerman concedes that there may be other conceptions of obligation, this is not an objection to his stated view. And yet there's this: As noted at the outset, Zimmerman identifies his notion of obligation -- Z-obligation -- as "the notion of obligation with which the morally conscientious agent is concerned". But if there is a second, more objective notion of obligation, the conscientious agent is surely equally concerned with it. Why does the conscientious agent reflect, gather information, and seek advice? Why does she do her best to remember when she's made a promise? The obvious answer is that she does these things so that she will be in a better position to know what she must do.

Zimmerman allows that inquiry of a limited sort is warranted if that's what one wants to know. Since our Z-obligations are determined by our justified beliefs, someone who wants to know her Z-obligations will reflect in order to determine which of her beliefs are justified, and which act is projectably best given those beliefs. But if this were the sole aim of deontic inquiry it could always be achieved without gathering evidence, and without revising one's already justified credences in light of one's evidence in order to render them more determinate. It would be enough simply by delete one's unjustified beliefs without replacement, since that would disclose the justified beliefs that fix one's current Z-obligations. A conscientious moral agent would never be content with this limited "inquiry" if more were possible. If her evidence warrants more determinate credences, or if easily attainable evidence would warrant different credences, then her question, "What are my obligations?" is one whose answer often depends on facts that substantive inquiry might disclose. Zimmerman cannot say this. One of the most striking consequences of his view is that substantive inquiry works to modify our obligations. Of course Zimmerman can say that we are often obliged to modify our obligations in this way. So the objection is not that his view counsels laziness or complacency. The issue rather concerns the aim of substantive moral inquiry. Many of us will find it obvious that the point is often to get a better view of the obligations we have anyway, and that the conscientious agent engages in moral inquiry because she cares about obligations of this sort. She may also care about her Z-obligations. But if she does, there is no such thing as "the sense of obligation with which the morally conscientious agent is concerned".


Jackson, Frank. 1991. Decision-Theoretic Consequentialism and the Nearest and Dearest Objection. Ethics 101: 461-82.

Smith, Holly M. 2011. "The 'Prospective View' of Obligation", Journal of Ethics and Social Philosophy, Discussion Note: 1-8.

Zimmerman, Michael J. 2008. Living with Uncertainty. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

[1] I follow Zimmerman in using "wrong" as short for "morally ought not to be done".

[2] If value can vary continuously, this should be an integral.

[3] My abbreviations, following Zimmerman's exposition at p. 36, n. 6.

[4] The harshness of the judgment is softened by the acknowledgement (125), that of course the defendant does not deserve his punishment, desert, unlike obligation, being an objective matter.