Images of History: Kant, Benjamin, Freedom and the Human Subject

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Richard Eldridge, Images of History: Kant, Benjamin, Freedom and the Human Subject, Oxford University Press, 2016, 235pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190605322.

Reviewed by Richard Velkley, Tulane University


Richard Eldridge has written original, illuminating and highly regarded books on Wittgenstein, Romanticism, the philosophy of art and modernism in the arts. His philosophic themes and problematic have debts he readily avows to Stanley Cavell.

In a manner recalling Cavell, Eldridge shows the philosophic import of authors and questions usually placed on the periphery of philosophy. His first book, on Wittgenstein, exposes affinities between that philosopher and the thought of Goethe and Romantic philosophy. In the present work he relates the central pillar of philosophic modernity, Kant, to a writer rarely considered a philosopher by analytically trained Anglophone philosophers, Walter Benjamin. In the course of his study one becomes acquainted with Kant as deeply engaged with history as a realm of critical-conjectural use of the imagination, and with Benjamin as a thinker in dialogue with the issues of Kantian philosophy, not least Kant's reflection on history. But Eldridge does more than write a comparative study of approaches to history. His book is a reflection on tensions between systematic and universalist ideas of moral theorizing and attentive regard for the contingencies and particularities of experience. He does not propose to resolve the tension; on the contrary, he presents the sustained awareness of the tension as a necessity for philosophy, and he criticizes philosophic tendencies that neglect it. The book is thus an apology for a way of philosophizing.

Philosophy as Eldridge conceives it, as coming to terms with human finitude, eschews causal groundings and absolute foundations for human thought and practice, and proceeds through dialogical understanding with others that acknowledges the forces that contravene attaining perfect accord. "Doing this well will require reading oneself and others -- one's commitments, desires, fears, hopes, and those of others -- in the lights of historical understanding, a sense of narrative emplotment shaped by literature, and comparative, critical philosophical reflection about values " (190). Historical understanding addresses a human mode of living that is interpretive, and accessible only in normative, holistic terms and not by calculable metrics. Non-qualitative proposals of law-related behavior also fail to grasp the true character of human "propositional attitudes." Eldridge's thinking here relates to a well-established tradition of anti-positivist, anti-behaviorist theories of intentional agency (G.E.M. Anscombe, G. von Wright, et al.), but to this line of reflection Eldridge adds an agonistic and tragic note of German idealist and Romantic provenance. This latter tradition of thought (which has antecedents in Vico, Montesquieu, Hume, Rousseau, Gibbon, and Burke) endorses the idea that the pursuit of political-moral ideals cannot be separated from narratives of historical understanding. This tradition brings the element of inevitable conflict to the fore, culminating in the Hegelian trope of the human as an "amphibious animal" grappling with oppositions which "have always preoccupied and troubled human consciousness, even if it is modern culture that has worked them out most sharply and driven them up to the peak of harshest contradiction" (from Hegel, Lectures on Fine Art, cited by Eldridge).

Eldridge poses the problem as the question

Can human subjectivity find itself at home in what is done and what is to be done by taking on a meaningful social role, or is it doomed, and if so how far, to be forever confronted by social routines that it finds in some measure cold and alien, mere dead necessities for the moderation and disguise of what ultimately remains for many a form of violence? (11)

Eldridge does not address the problem with a dialectical-conciliatory response but, avowing the permanence of conflict, espies moments of hopeful vision in Kant and of ecstatic release in Benjamin -- in what for him are the most compelling examples of historical thinking. The readings of these authors portray a Kant that is more equivocal, open to failure and perplexity, than is usually presented, and a Benjamin whose view of historical fate is not wholly despairing and apocalyptic. In both writers Eldridge discovers what he calls constructivist-realist images of history, wherein history is interpreted in terms of moral images of the world (a phrase borrowed from Dieter Henrich). They are constructive insofar as the moral ideals are not given as natural facts or laws, and realist insofar as "traces" of these ideals can be found in historical experience. Something like a moral telos can be glimpsed through careful attention to experience for both thinkers. Eldridge sees in them exemplary alternative approaches to the question "How might we, as the amphibious animals we are, best develop and pursue historically a moral image of the world?" That being said, a gulf seems to open up between Kant's advocacy of gradualist reform based on self-discipline and positive engagement with existing institutions and Benjamin's revolutionary temper, in search of sudden "fugitive and half-dreamt" illuminations that break with traditional structures.

On closer inspection, Kant's historical thought reveals a more complex situation. Thus with regard to formulating the idea that structures the whole system of reason, Kant speaks of necessarily beginning with inchoate concepts of architectonic order that are formed "rhapsodically" from a "germ" in reason: the ultimate goals of reason cannot be based on fixed anticipations. This has some resemblance to Benjamin's notion of a "nucleus of time, hidden in the knower and the known alike." For Kant the effort to live freely advances without possessing full understanding of how to proceed. The materials of history are treated critically with an eye toward spotting "guiding threads" in which retrospective assessments of history support the striving to realize the ends of freedom. In this connection Eldridge criticizes prominent versions of Kantian autonomy (explicitly Christine Korsgaard's) that stress self-given normative reasons that fail "to face what is reasonably possible in history." Common to Kant and Benjamin is the positing of the natural situation of the human as "indigence," evident in enduring conflict (antinomies of reason and of social life in Kant, the "wreckage of history" in Benjamin). This indigence means that with respect to the human inheritance there can be no uncritical appeal to "what has been," but thinking calls for a "Copernican revolution" involving the "primacy of practice," in which imaginative, conjectural engagements reinterpret the past history and prospects of reason. Political ideas and historical understanding "bootstrap" each other to promote awakening to hidden possibilities of freedom.

As Eldridge argues, historical thinking is central to Kant's critical enterprise in that it is a demand of moral reason that humans strive to actualize the potential of the highest good as idea. "The possibility of morality must be legible in the world if its commands are to count for us" (76). In this effort a practical "orientation" must be found where cognitive insight is lacking. The hope (rational faith) supporting the moral project rests on grounds that are subjectively sufficient but objectively insufficient. Experience offers a few "signs" of convergence between the moral project and the course of events, such as the sympathy of European observers for the French Revolution, as this discloses a faculty in human nature for improvement. As Eldridge notes, this feeling is analogous to the feeling associated with the imaginative act whereby "another nature" is created in artistic production, using given material, as the imagination and understanding in free play elude the laws of association (Critique of the Power of Judgment, section 49). The morally motivated imaginative engagement with history is the subject of "Idea of a Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View," where Kant calls for the use of our imaginative powers to disclose a "deeply concealed plan of nature" in human affairs. As in the Critique of the Power of Judgment, the idea of nature as purposively organized is only regulative. In this free construction of nature, what "nature has willed" is the development of our rational nature (the improvement of the moral disposition) through the unfolding of the consequences of our non-moral self-regard. Human nature is both subject and object of Bildung.

Eldridge exposes how Kant's conjectural construction of history, an attempt "that must be regarded as possible" for the purposes of reflective orientation furthering the moral use of reason, employs contingent anthropological and political-practical assumptions, none of which is capable of proof. These include: (1) the human, unlike other animals, is not limited by instinct; (2) in labor the human has a principle of productive self-development; (3) human relations are shaped by unsocial sociability, the competitive culture of mutual comparison and recognition; (4) the full achievement of moral cultivation depends on establishing a just political order, which is "the greatest problem for the human species." Eldridge claims that the creation of a universal order of republican states rests on two far from sufficient assumptions: that the competition of states promotes freedom and that the disadvantages of war lead to a general desire for peace. Kant's argument converts only the already converted.

Beyond that, there are the well-known provisos concerning moral self-determination, that we lack proof of possessing more than instrumental reason, whereas we have much evidence that the human will is deflected toward self-interest. "From such crooked wood as man is made nothing straight can be fashioned" ("Idea," sixth thesis). At the same time, Eldridge convincingly argues that such historical-philosophical reflections are central to the critical rethinking of reason. (In this regard, Eldridge might have commented on the profound reinterpretation of the speculative interests of reason in "ideas" in terms of practical interests in the first two Critiques.) Such considerations are emerging in the work of numerous scholars (some of whom Eldridge cites); and the laborious task of poring over the details of foundational arguments concerning autonomy in the Groundwork and second Critique, which employs the talents of so much Kant scholarship, can be seen as a preoccupation with what Kant regards as just a scaffolding (indeed one subject to revision) for the true structure that he has in view.

Another writing that is important for the appreciation of that structure, Religion within the Limits of Mere Reason, makes even more evident than "Idea" that the critical reflection on realizing the end of freedom in the sensible world requires a "responsive participation in normative linguistic and cultural practices," since no human being forms maxims simply on an individual basis. Not just the individual's ability to grasp the moral law, but also improved understanding of what counts as an expression of respect, undergirds the hope for the advance of the moral disposition of the species. Thus the germ of goodness within the human, which is always opposed by the danger of choosing to give in to contingent yet enduring grounds of temptation (radical evil), needs support from a community of ethical practice, a visible church with a tradition of doctrines and rites, to promote the "change of heart" or the internal revolution of moral disposition, that would be fully realized in a non-coercive ethical commonwealth. Yet this is a "sublime and never fully attainable ideal," as the visible, historical church (a rather idealized version of Christianity) never wholly overcomes the weakness in the human (the grounding of moral faith in service to God), even as it is indispensable for progress to pure moral faith (whereby the visible church works for its own undoing). The progress of the moral life is inseparable from conditions that prevent the complete attainment of its end; the conflict between historical and pure rational faith is unending. (See Religion, Part Three, third paragraph, Akademie Ausgabe. 6:95.)

By laying bare the fissures in Kant's account of history, Eldridge makes the transition to Benjamin less jarring. A concept of historical existence underlies Benjamin's critical-philosophical corpus, but one poised against all progressivism, and indeed one that wars against the idea of the continuity of culture. Benjamin speaks of "brushing history against the grain," overturning tradition so as to recover discarded meanings, and awakening a sense of the "secret sources" of tradition. Apocatastasis (restoration, restitution) is a key term of the Arcades Project. In seeking lost treasures buried beneath the detritus of modern culture, Benjamin is allied with Heidegger's Destruktion of the tradition and other recovery projects of the Weimar era (Gershom Scholem, Hans-Georg Gadamer, Leo Strauss), while he has a modernist literary sensibility that links him to Theodor Adorno. Benjamin pursues encounters with material (especially urban) culture, awaiting "abrupt revelations of meaning," as actively receptive attention promises unplanned, spontaneous insights into a "messianic" dimension of things. The hope of uncovering hidden fragments of divine life has kinship with Jewish-Gnostic thought, and seems wholly remote from modern rationalism. As Adorno famously declared, Benjamin experienced deep hostility to idealist conceptions of the subject and autonomy.

But this is by no means the whole story, as Eldridge shows through a triangulation of Kant, Hölderlin, and Goethe, whose different vectors helped shape Benjamin's thought.

Benjamin heard lectures of Hermann Cohen and planned a doctoral dissertation on Kant's philosophy of history. The project was intended to bring together a revised version of Kant's system with a sense of the historical present. Benjamin complained that Kant's account of freedom lacked true relation to nature, and the account of nature (the phenomenal) excluded the presence of religion and the aesthetic. Benjamin could not find in Kant, accordingly, a sense of historical time different from the continuous succession of scientific, law-governed, nature, as Benjamin looked for a non-causal, non-successive "gathering of time" in the present. But Benjamin's concept of Anschaulichkeit, as aesthetic absorption in the object involving a free play of powers, and offering an image of the free human life, points directly to Kant. (It is odd, then, that Benjamin did not find more room in his thought for Kant's account of reflective judging on nature and in the work of art, as suggesting that nature and freedom have a common substrate.) What is more, Eldridge proposes that Kant's approach to history as infinite interpretive task of finding meaning is deeply related to Benjamin's.

To Hölderlin, on Eldridge's account, Benjamin owes the idea of poetic theorizing as harmonious alternation between free reflection and absorption in the object, whereby the subject recognizes its unity in the harmoniously opposed elements of the poem's structure. But perhaps more remarkable is Benjamin's sympathy with Goethe's account of fate, i.e., with the philosopher-poet's conviction of the futility of human efforts to master the incomprehensible ambivalence of nature. Goethe wrote of the contradictory forces of nature as "demonic" and "mythic," and although skeptical about the ability of human institutions and Bildung to overcome these forces, he conceived the writer's life as a struggle to free itself from such powers. Benjamin takes from Goethe the sense that concealed beneath beauty and harmony, genuine art reveals the presence of chaos and death. There is a certain liberating effect in this insight, in the recognition that human life is unthinkable as wholly fulfilled, and that a world without the energies that summon critical intelligence to action would be desolate.

Eldridge's book not only enriches our grasp of its two principal authors and our appreciation of the problems of historical understanding. It is a refreshing departure from a strong tendency in contemporary philosophy to convey the nostrum that suitable mutually recognizing discourses and rational norm-giving are adequate to satisfy our intelligent sense of life with its complexity and its intractable problems. Eldridge writes of "the temptation, wish, or fantasy to find an absolute ground both of assurance in linguistic performance and of the achievement of practical self-unity and reasonable self-presentation under an intelligible role" (188). His lively and penetrating study of Kant and Benjamin should help to firm up resistance to this temptation.