Imagination and Convention: Distinguishing Grammar and Inference in Language

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Ernie Lepore and Matthew Stone, Imagination and Convention: Distinguishing Grammar and Inference in Language, Oxford University Press, 2015, 292pp., $49.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780198717188.

Reviewed by Lenny Clapp, Northern Illinois University


The fundamental issue addressed by Ernie Lepore and Matthew Stone in this book concerns the division of labor between two modes of communication: that which relies on conventional meaning and that which relies only on general pragmatic reasoning. In order to get a feel for the contrast, let's consider the game of charades. Some things competent charades players do exploit established conventions. For example, when I touch four extended fingers to my forearm, that action means that the word I want you to guess has four syllables. Because my action's having such a meaning is matter of convention, it means what it does regardless of my intentions in performing it. In contrast, my subsequent action of writhing around on the floor while gazing heavenward has no conventional meaning, and as a consequence what I mean by writhing while gazing -- if it is even appropriate to use 'mean' here -- is entirely dependent upon my intentions. If my intention is to get you to think apocalypse, then what I mean by writhing while gazing is apocalypse. And there are corresponding differences regarding your understanding of my actions. Your understanding what is meant by my touching my fingers to my forearm is a matter of your knowing the convention. In contrast, your understanding what I mean by writhing while gazing requires you to figure out my intention in doing that, and this seems to involve reliance on general principles that govern rational interaction; you make guesses, i.e. inferences, based upon the principle that what I am doing somehow makes sense given that I am trying to get you to figure out what I have in mind.

Lepore and Stone are concerned with the division of labor between these modes of communication in verbal conversation: To what extent is the meaning of an utterance a matter of linguistic conventions, and to what extent is it a matter of interpreters figuring out why the speaker performed the utterance? This is the arena in which the work of Grice (1957, 1975) continues to be extremely influential. Grice's theory of conversational implicature (CI) is particularly relevant since a CI is, according to Grice, something that a speaker means by her utterance that goes beyond, or is contrary to, the conventional meaning of the sentence she utters. Lepore and Stone's central thesis, however, is that "both the data and the explanatory apparatus of the Gricean program and its various successors require profound reinterpretation" (6), and they are particularly concerned to establish that "the category of conversational implicatures does no theoretical work" (83).

The book's fourteen chapters are organized into four parts. In Part I Lepore and Stone review Grice's theory of CIs and trace its influence on a wide variety of views in philosophy, linguistics and cognitive science. These views include possible worlds semantics and pragmatics (Stalnaker, 1978), the theory of collaboration in artificial intelligence (Thomason, 1990), approaches to meaning in linguistic pragmatics (Horn, 1984; Levinson, 2000), the approach of relevance theory in cognitive linguistics (Sperber and Wilson, 1986), and theories of choice in psychology (Pinker et al., 2008). In Part II Lepore and Stone argue that some interpretative effects that are often taken to be CIs ought not be characterized as CIs because research in linguistics and cognitive science has revealed that the interpretive effects in question "are in fact triggered by the specific and varied rules of individual languages" (4). The interpretive phenomena discussed in Part II are related to speech acts, presupposition, and information structure. In Part III Lepore and Stone consider interpretative phenomena related to figurative uses of language, including irony, sarcasm, metaphor, and humor. They again argue that interpretive effects that have been categorized as CIs are not actually CIs. But the reason these figurative uses cannot be understood as generating CIs is not because the interpretive effects in question are revealed to be triggered by conventional linguistic rules but rather because they lack two essential features of CIs: (i) they do not involve a homogeneous process of reasoning from general principles of rationality, but instead involve "heterogeneous kinds of thinking, aimed at different goals and appealing to different principles" (5), and (ii) such figurative uses do not require interpreters "to derive some further hidden message" but rather to "engage with the speaker's utterance in particular ways and to think things through for themselves" (190). In Part IV Lepore and Stone criticize Grice's fundamental "reduction of meaning to communicative intention" (6), and, relying on some insights of Lewis (1969, 1979), they offer "a new, broader philosophical conception of the domain of conventional meaning" (7). The book thus covers a lot of ground. I will limit myself to making some critical remarks concerning one thesis advanced in Part II and posing some general questions concerning the more general philosophical program in Part IV.

One issue addressed in Part II concerns how an interpreter identifies the speech act, or acts, the speaker is performing in uttering a sentence. Is what speech act(s) is (are) performed by an utterance information that is conversationally implicated by the speaker in making the utterance? Or is this information somehow indicated by conventional linguistic rules? A compelling reason to think that speech act identification must involve something like a conversational implicature is that the same sentence can be used to perform many different speech acts. Consider a simple sentence in the indicative mood: 'John is thirsty'. A speaker who utters this sentence might be performing any one, or several, of the following speech acts: answering a question concerning John's current state of comfort; requesting that the addressee bring a drink for John; explaining why John is waving to the bartender; concluding that John is thirsty based upon available evidence; supposing that John is thirsty in order facilitate the investigation of some related question; or correcting a previous assertion that nobody is thirsty. (This list is of course not intended to be exhaustive.)

Lepore and Stone, however, argue that this one-many relationship between sentences and speech acts is better explained as owing to an ambiguity of sentences, so that identifying the speech act being performed is really a matter of resolving an ambiguity in the conventional meaning of the utterance: "we are able to capture the ambiguity here the same way one would describe any other kind of ambiguity, as reflecting the alternative possibilities for analyzing an utterance according to speakers' knowledge of language" (113). I am skeptical of their proposal that the identification the speech act(s) instantiated by an utterance can be accurately characterized as a kind of disambiguation.

Lepore and Stone begin their discussion of the speech act identification problem by considering the following question:

(89) Can you play Chopin's E minor prelude?

They observe that "A speaker might use (89) to inquire about how a friend's piano lessons have progressed . . . [or] . . . to put in a request for the piece that should come next in a friend's performance" (98). They then explain this dual possibility by positing that "the word can simply has two distinct but closely related meanings" (98).[1] Following Searle (1975), I think it is plausible that it is (now) a matter of convention that (89) can be used to perform "indirect requests." But it does not follow that (89) is ambiguous (or polysemous) between a question interpretation and a request interpretation. For, as Searle pointed out, utterances of (89) that are indirect requests are also at the same time direct questions; that this is so is evidenced by the fact that one can respond to a typical utterance of (89) with either (i) "I'd be glad to" or (ii) "No, I can't". Since a typical utterance of (89) is both a request and a question, it is not true that one can "capture the ambiguity here the same way one would describe any other kind of ambiguity" (106).

Moreover, though I concede that the sentence (89) is, as a matter of convention, associated with indirect requesting, such conventional indicators of speech act (what Searle called illocutionary force indicating devices) are not always present. Lepore and Stone seem to accept this, as at one point they state that the speech act instantiated by an utterance of  89 "is not a matter of syntactic structure or semantic content. It's a matter of what the speaker is doing" (106).[2] But how can we capture the fact that one sentence can be used to perform many different speech acts as an ambiguity, if the speech act instantiated by an utterance of the sentence is merely "a matter of what the speaker is doing"? Lepore and Stone propose that the above array of potential interpretations of an utterance of 'John is thirsty' is to be explained as an ambiguity, but at the same time they seem to deny that there is any feature of the utterance that one can point to as being ambiguous. This seems to stretch the notion of ambiguity too far. If Lepore and Stone are permitted to categorize 'John is thirsty' as "ambiguous" merely because different utterances of it can be interpreted as instantiating different speech acts, then it is not clear how we can distinguish between the view that different utterances of 'There's a gas station around the corner' generate different CIs and the view that this sentence is "ambiguous."

Let us set aside the issue of whether or not the problem of speech act identification can be accurately characterized as a sort of disambiguation and consider how Lepore and Stone propose to explain how an interpreter identifies the speech act(s) performed by an utterance if not by appeal to (something like) CIs. Lepore and Stone claim that they "follow the approach to the linguistics of discourse developed in Coherence Theory" (106), and they cite Asher and Lascarides (2003) as providing the sort of detailed theory they have in mind. According to Asher and Lascarides' segmented discourse representation theory, interpreting an utterance of a discourse (or conversation) requires an interpreter to identify how the utterance is rhetorically related to the previous utterances of the discourse, and the various rhetorical relations are construed as speech acts, such as narration, explanation, elaboration, correction, etc. An entire coherent discourse is then analyzed as a sort of hierarchical structure of utterances that are related by such relational speech acts. Thus, on Asher and Lascarides' version of coherence theory, solving the speech act identification problem is a matter of interpreters determining how utterances are rhetorically related to each other to form coherent discourses.

If their coherence theory is to provide support for Lepore and Stone's view that solving the speech act identification problem does not require interpreters to make inferences based upon general principles of rationality, then Asher and Lascarides must maintain that identifying how utterances are rhetorically related to each other to form coherent discourses does not involve interpreters making inferences based upon general principles of rationality. The problem is that Asher and Lascarides explicitly invoke such general pragmatic inferences to account for how appropriate rhetorical relations are identified. In contrast to what Lepore and Stone claim concerning the implications and commitments of coherence theory, Asher and Lascarides claim that "the computation of discourse structure . . . is predicated upon general principles of cooperativity and rationality" (2003, 428). Moreover, instead of claiming that their version of coherence theory repudiates the need for the category of CIs, Asher and Lascarides claim that "what Grice terms conversational implicatures arise as a byproduct of product of practical reasoning about the demands that discourse coherence imposes" (2003, 421). Both Lepore and Stone and Asher and Lascarides discuss the following example due originally to Grice (1975),

(6)            A. I'm out of gas

      B. There's a gas station around the corner.

Lepore and Stone claim that "coherence theory suggests that (6) illustrates a conventional rhetorical strategy for responding to a reported difficulty with a suggestion about how to resolve it" (114). In contrast, Asher and Lascarides claim that "the implicature is a byproduct of computing discourse update" (2003, 421). I endorse "the linguistics of discourse developed in Coherence Theory" (106) to explain how interpreters are able to identify the speech act(s) instantiated by an utterance, but it is far from clear that this approach can be invoked to support Lepore and Stone's claims that "pragmatics can be, at most, a theory of disambiguation" and that "we have no use for a category of conversational implicatures" (6).

In Part IV Lepore and Stone criticize Grice's (1957) fundamental "view that the meaning of an utterance derives from the changes that the speaker plans for the utterance to bring about in the conversation" (200), and they advocate in its place the view that "the speaker's intentions determine the meaning of a utterance by linking it up with the relevant conventions" (200). They dub the Gricean view "prospective intentionalism," and they dub their preferred alternative "direct intentionalism." Lepore and Stone use 'direct' here to make explicit the similarities between their view and the theory of direct reference (Kripke, 1972). According to direct reference what is meant by a use of, e.g., 'Gödel' is largely determined by the background of linguistic conventions governing the use of names. In order for one to use 'Gödel' meaningfully one need only use it with the basic intention to participate in this convention; it is not necessary that one have the prospective intention of causing some specific person(s) to think about Gödel. Lepore and Stone thus summarize the similar fundamental idea of direct intentionalism as follows:

The general assumption is that, because we subscribe consistently to linguistic conventions, they apply to what we say, as long as some very general background conditions are met. A word, in virtue of the conventions, gives us a connection to its meaning. We can access the meaning by saying the word -- it's part of our basic repertoire for interacting with each other. And syntactic structures give us basic ways to compose meanings into complex content and make corresponding contributions to conversation (212).

Lepore and Stone invoke two insights from David Lewis to flesh out this general description of direct intentionalism. First, they appropriate some of the formal apparatus developed in Lewis (1969) to describe the nature of linguistic conventions and the requisite general background conditions: very roughly, according to Lewis a convention is a social competence that constitutes a solution to a recurring coordination problem. And, second, they utilize Lewis' (1979) conception of a conversational score to articulate what contributions to conversation are specifically relevant to meaning: according to Lepore and Stone, the conversational score -- which they prefer to call the conversational record -- is a record of "only the specific coordination that supports our inquiry in making our ideas public and arriving at shared commitments for how things are" (257). The alternative conception of meaning offered by direct intentionalism then seems to be something like this: The meaning of an utterance is determined by only those conventions that govern how the utterance updates the conversational record, and in order for an utterance to have this meaning the speaker need only have the basic intention to participate in these conventions. This conception of meaning thus implies a corresponding conception of semantics: "semantics describes interlocutors' social competence in coordinating on the conversational record" (256).

Part IV contains the most ambitious and philosophical arguments and proposals, and it presents several related questions of interpretation. Some of these questions concern how the various components of Grice's program fit together. What is the relationship between Grice's notion of speaker meaning and the category of CIs? Can one reject the former and retain the latter? And what is the nature of Grice's "reduction of meaning to communicative intention" (6)? Is the reduction ontological in nature, so that meaning facts are alleged to be ontologically grounded in communicative intentions? Or is the reduction merely a sort of conceptual analysis?[3] Other questions arise because both Grice's program and Lepore and Stone's proposed alternative are programmatic. Should Lewis' two insights be taken as developments of Grice's program or as elements of an alternative program? It is not obvious, at least not to me, how to answer these questions, and as a consequence it is not obvious, at least not to me, that direct intentionalism is incompatible with Grice's program.[4] That is, though Lepore and Stone succeed in illustrating how the conception of meaning articulated by direct intentionalism is not equivalent to the Gricean category of speaker meaning, it not clear why we must take prospective intentionalism and direct intentionalism to be competing views. Regardless of its compatibility or incompatibility with Grice's program, however, Lepore and Stone's articulation of direct intentionalism offers a strategy for combining into a unified theory both fundamental philosophical theories concerning the nature of intentions and cooperative activity and empirical theories in linguistics and cognitive science concerning the particular mechanism of natural languages. This is a significant accomplishment.

For the reasons presented above, I am skeptical that  Lepore and Stone succeed in undermining Grice's program. Nonetheless, I wholeheartedly recommend their book for anyone interested in the relationship between conventional meaning and cooperative rational action and the attendant issue of how to understand the relationship between pragmatics and semantics. The manner in which Lepore and Stone trace the influence of Grice's fundamental ideas through a web of interrelated issues and theories provides a broad perspective that facilitates a more comprehensive understanding of some of the recent debates in the philosophy of language. Moreover, the positive proposals advanced in Parts III and IV, in particular the proposals concerning figurative uses of language and the combination of Lewis' ideas to articulate a more empirically informed conception of the relationship between semantics and pragmatics, are insightful and worthy of further development. In the preface Lepore and Stone state, "Whether you endorse our views or contest them, we hope our book helps you to articulate your own views about language more robustly and to draw more eclectically in your thinking on data and theories from across cognitive science" (v). If you read Imagination and Convention, what Lepore and Stone hope will come to pass.


Asher, N. and Lascarides, A. 2003. Logics of Conversation. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Grice, H.P. 1957. Meaning. Philosophical Review, 66(3): 377-88.

Grice, H.P. 1975. Logic and Conversation. In P. Cole and J. Morgan (eds), Syntax and Semantics III: Speech Acts, 41-58. New York: Academic Press.

Horn, L. 1984. Toward a New Taxonomy for Pragmatic Inference: Q-Based and R-Based Implicature. In D. Schiffrin (ed), Meaning, Form, and Use in Context: Linguistic Applications, 11-42. Washington, DC: Georgetown University Press.

Kripke, S. 1972. Naming and Necessity. In G. Harman and D. Davidson (eds), Semantics of Natural Language, 253-355. Dordrecht: Reidel.

Levinson, S. 2000. Presumptive Meanings: The Theory of Generalized Conversational Implicatures. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Lewis, D. 1969. Convention: A Philosophical Study. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.

Lewis, D. 1979. Scorekeeping in a Language Game. Journal of Philosophical Logic, 8(3): 339-359.

Neale, S. 1992. Paul Grice and the Philosophy of Language. Linguistics and Philosophy, 15(5): 509-59.

Pinker, S., Nowak, M., and Lee, J. 2008. The Logic of Indirect Speech. Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences of the United States of America, 105(3): 833-8.

Searle, J. 1975. Indirect Speech Acts. In P. Cole and J. Morgan (eds), Syntax and Semantics III: Speech Acts, 59-82. New York: Academic Press.

Sperber, D. and Wilson, D. 1986. Relevance: Communication and Cognition. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.

Stalnaker, R. 1978. Assertion. In P. Cole (ed), Syntax and Semantics, IX: Pragmatics, 315-32. New York: Academic Press.

Thomason, R. 1990. Accommodation, Meaning and Implicature. In P. Cohen, J. Morgan, and M. Pollack (eds), Intentions in Communication, 325-63. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

[1] Of course Lepore and Stone must reject Searle's (1975) proposal that the request meaning derived from the question meaning as a result of the conventionalization of a Gricean inference.

[2] This claim is actually made specifically about (89), and this is perplexing. How can it be that, on the one hand, the fact that (89) can be used to both ask questions and make requests is to be captured by the fact that 'can' "has two distinct but closely related meanings" (98), while on the other hand, "the interpretive difference among readings of (89) is not a matter of . . . semantic content" (106)?

[3] Neale (1992) provides a clear overview of Grice's views, as well as some plausible answers to some of these interpretive questions.

[4] Lepore and Stone concede that their differences with Grice "are rather subtle" (200).