Imagination and Social Perspectives: Approaches from Phenomenology and Psychopathology

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Michela Summa, Thomas Fuchs and Luca Vanzago (eds.), Imagination and Social Perspectives: Approaches from Phenomenology and Psychopathology, Routledge, 2018, 358pp., $150.00, ISBN 9781138221000.

Reviewed by Kenneth Williford, University of Texas at Arlington


This is an impressive and useful collection of seventeen "cross-pollinating", thematically overlapping, original papers of manageable length mainly devoted to some intersection of these topics: imagination, intersubjectivity (including here empathy, theory of mind, and simulation theory), perspective-taking, social intentionality (including "we-intentionality" and "collective imagining"), and aesthetics. As is appropriate for a volume in the recently inaugurated Routledge series, Research in Phenomenology, the papers are rooted in or at least make some contact with the phenomenological tradition. Husserl's treatments of imagination, perception, and intersubjectivity, among other matters, are very lucidly discussed throughout. And there are papers entirely or substantially devoted to Scheler, Stein, Sartre, Merleau-Ponty, and Levinas. As the subtitle indicates, the orientation is enriched by contributions (two of them by philosopher-psychiatrists, Thomas Fuchs and Zeno Van Duppen) on psychopathologies (autism and schizophrenia, in particular) that have profound effects on the character of an individual's intersubjective and imaginative lives.

In my opinion, at least, this collection is welcome indeed since it draws into sharp relief the important but often overlooked connections among imagination, intersubjectivity, and perspective-taking of all kinds. While those schooled in the phenomenological tradition are well aware that these interlocking themes were of central concern to Husserl, Stein, Sartre and company, it has, with some exceptions, taken a little more time for analytical philosophers of mind and cognitive scientists to realize just how crucial perspective-taking is to understanding the structures and functions of consciousness (see, e.g., Rudrauf et al. 2017). For those less familiar with the tradition but "open to strangeness", this volume can serve as a high-level introduction to the phenomenological treatment of these themes; for those well acquainted with the tradition, the volume offers new and interesting interpretations and connections across multiple philosophical traditions and figures (including Spinoza, Kant, and Wittgenstein as well as phenomenologists) and various relevant disciplines (e.g., developmental and clinical psychology, psychiatry and psychopathology, sociology).

If the collection can be faulted it is only in regard to the inevitable flaws that attend any production this rich: it contains some typographical and stylistic infelicities (as well as a somewhat amusing editorial survival -- see p. 78, note 5); there are a couple of papers that could have been left out without much damage being done; and, taken as a whole, the contents are so variegated and incompressible that one is left somewhat stunned and overwhelmed by it all. We are dealing with something more like a multiverse here than a best of all possible worlds. But we should be used to this by now; it is our lot.

The introduction by the editors, while clear and of some interest in its own right, does not adequately prepare one for the twists and turns of the papers in the volume; but probably no introduction of reasonable length could do that. The book has five sections, each containing three papers, save Section III, which contains five. It could have been organized differently, but given the incompressibility and resonating character of the papers' collective contents, there is really no optimal solution to the organizing problem here:

Section I: "Imagination and the As-If: Experiencing Multiple Realities"

Section II: "Imagination and Intersubjectivity in Psychopathology"

Section III: "Imagination and the Experience of Others"

Section IV: "The Sociality of Imagination"

Section V: "Aesthetic, Ethical, and Socio-Political Grounds of Perspective-Taking"

Evidently, it will be possible only to hit some highlights in this review. Readers should not infer from my selection that I regard the papers not discussed as inferior or unworthy of serious study, but rather only that we are dealing with a word limit.

In Section I, Andrea Altobrando's "Imagining Oneself" takes up, among other things, one of Bernard Williams' classic "problems of the self", and a relatively sticky one at that: the problem of imagining oneself as another (pp. 33ff.). Here the problem is supposed to be more difficult than merely imagining (or remembering) oneself to have properties one does not currently have. As the story goes, one is not just imagining that P(i) even though one knows ~P(i). Rather, it seems that one is imagining that i = o, where one knows that, necessarily, i ≠ o -- taking i and o to be rigid designators here. If so, then in imagining oneself to be another, one is attempting to imagine the logically impossible. One might as well try to imagine a round square.

We can recall that, given the Indiscernibility of Identicals, the same problem actually attends imagining or, for that matter, remembering oneself to have properties one does not currently have (and leads one to consider the endurantism vs. perdurantism dilemma, the transworld identity vs. counterpart theory debate, and related metaphysical matters). Putting this aside as well as the question of whether work on paraconsistency and the perception of "impossible figures" has, so to speak, made it easier to imagine the impossible, Altobrando zeroes in on exactly what is at stake here, usefully deploying Williams' notion of the "Cartesian Self" (which he compares, plausibly I think, to Husserl's notion of the "pure ego", pp. 35ff).

We not only seem to be able to vary all of our accidental properties in imagination, we seem to be able to imagine ourselves to be or to have been different individuals altogether. This means that we have some notion of ourselves as individuals that is effectively empty of substantial content (or "beyond the principle of individuation" as Altobrando puts it (p. 25)), a sense of our "bare particularity", if you like. But contrary to initial appearances, this does not impede our ability to imagine being another; in fact, it facilitates it. At the level of bare particularity, identity and difference are just irremediably contingent-seeming facts. Bare particular (pure ego, Cartesian Self) A is not bare particular B -- end of story. Since this particularity is "bare" or empty as well as brute, it is actually quite easy to imagine the identities of A and B switching. If this is imagining something logically impossible, it is more analogous to imagining Goldbach's Conjecture to be true (when it is in fact false) or false (when it is in fact true) than to imagining a round square. In the former case, no contradiction, supposing the Conjecture to be unprovable, is visible whether one considers it or its negation, though, presumably, one is necessarily true and the other necessarily false. While it certainly is true that imagining oneself to be another involves more than mere conception (e.g., simulation, projection, empathy), which may arguably be all that is involved in the Goldbach Conjecture case, it is important that it not seem to us to involve the attempt to generate a quasi-intuitive (in the sense of anschaulich) presentation of something analogous to a round square. If this is on the right track, then many tortured passages on, and wild theories of, intersubjectivity that one finds in the phenomenological tradition may turn out to rest on a confusion about elementary differentiation and its relation to conceivability. Elementary differentiation, while perhaps a matter of metaphysical necessity, cannot but appear brute to us; and thus it is open to a kind of eidetic variation whereby I can imagine being you without any countersense. This is the real nugget of gold in Altobrando's paper.

The three papers in Section II ("The 'As-If' Function and Its Loss in Schizophrenia" by Thomas Fuchs, "Intersubjective Expression in Autism and Schizophrenia" by Till Grohmann, and "The Phenomenology of Intersubjective Reality in Schizophrenia" by Zeno Van Duppen) make an excellent triad. While it is obviously very important not to run the symptomologies of ASD and schizophrenia together (see Grohmann, pp. 99ff.), what emerges from this troika of papers is that these disorders can only be properly understood as disorders of intersubjectivity, imagination, and perspective-taking and that these concepts are themselves in need of a proper unifying theory, a theory to which the phenomenological tradition can make serious contributions. While this will not be news to everyone, the reflections of Fuchs, Grohmann, and Van Duppen together suggest this: get clear on the mechanisms of perspective-taking (in all its varieties) in consciousness, and we will be able to get clear on the exact nature of these and other psychopathologies and deficits (cf. Rudrauf et al. 2017). What we need is a good psychological model of perspective-taking at generic and specific levels. Perhaps with such a generative model in hand, we could predict various psychopathological symptomologies as deviations from the norm. These papers clearly highlight the need for such a model and demonstrate the contributions that work in the phenomenological tradition (including the tradition of phenomenological psychiatry) can make in this endeavor. This general statement does not do justice to the richness of these particular contributions, which are very rich indeed.

If there is a bit of an outlier, it is (perhaps somewhat unexpectedly) Rudolf Bernet's contribution on Spinoza ("Spinoza on the Role of Feelings, Imagination and Knowledge in Sex, Love, and Social Life"), the first paper in Section III. Its inclusion is not completely unwarranted in that it does indeed discuss the imagination and Spinoza's unsurprisingly interesting take on some of its functions. Moreover, the paper affords a rare opportunity to look at some of the problems of sex and love through Spinozistic optical instruments. The panorama that opens up is, by turns, quaint, inherently but naïvely sexist (it was the 17th century after all), psychologically profound nevertheless, and, for lack of a better word, "trippy" in the way it manages to combine the high metaphysical abstractions of the Ethics with the most intimate of concrete, fleshly intersubjective encounters -- though, of course, this sort of quotidian application is the point of Spinoza's whole . . . voyage. In this regard, Bernet's paper was well worth including in spite of its quasi-outlier status. It adds a fun tangent to the volume.

In Section III, Jens Bonnemann's "Sartre and the Role of Imagination in Mutual Understanding", offers an interesting but problematic suggestion about the role of imagination in Sartre's theory of intersubjectivity in Being and Nothingness. Bonnemann argues that the imagination is actually what enables "Being-For-Others", since one certainly cannot literally perceive-as-subject how one is encountered by the Other -- even if, on the Sartrean model, the encounter with the Other is, in a sense, direct, not a matter of inferring the Other's existence and attitudes from expressions or behaviors. When I am caught looking through the keyhole down upon my knees, to use Sartre's own example, and experience ontological Shame (as well as, in this case, the less primordial variety of shame), I know myself to be objectified by the Other in a way that I cannot access or control. But consider that all my projects aimed at achieving an identity for myself (e.g., my "playing at" being a waiter or a reviewer of philosophical books) are public projects -- they are all projects for the Other. I behave one way versus another because I want the Other to see me as one sort of person and not another. Thus, the point of view of the Other, while ineradicably alien and . . . well . . . other, still cannot be utterly incomprehensible to us. It cannot be like the "mind" of God in apophatic theology.

Bonnemann quite reasonably argues that the only mode of consciousness that can allow us some sort of approximate access to the points of view of Others is the imagination. Sartre does not exactly say this, but it is not an unreasonable suggestion in the context of his early philosophy. Given Sartre's fairly liberal understanding of what can serve as potential analogon for imaginative acts in The Imaginary, he should have no trouble finding suitable material on the basis of which one could imaginatively aim at the perspectives and attitudes the Other could direct towards the imaginer. The problem, of course, and one that bothered Edith Stein (see the nice introductory discussion in Chapter 9 of Smith 2016), is that the Other is not a fictional object or otherwise absent, different, or nullified, which is a requirement of the imaginary object according to Sartre. The Other is a real presence in one's lived experience and is experienced as being thus-and-so right here, right now.

In this sense, Husserl and Stein were right to make a closer, though still imperfect (as they knew) analogy with the "empty intending" of the unseen sides of physical objects that is fused with the perception of the properly seen sides. The disanalogy is that, unlike physical objects, the emptily intended sides of which one can circumambulate or rotate the object in order to see (e.g., the other side of a tree), thereby generating a "filled perceptual intention" of the previously unseen side, one can never get a filled intention of the very consciousness of the Other. So, while one may "appresent" or "co-present" the Other on the basis of (or directly "in") the Other's perceived facial expressions, bodily actions, and so on, there will always be something beyond the reach of perceptual intuition. (Perhaps this is why Sartre says in The Transcendence of the Ego that the Other is not only recalcitrant to intuition but even to conception as well, a remark that I have always found somewhat unsatisfactory because it suggests an "apophatic" model.) Another problem with Bonnemann's interpretive proposal in the Sartrean context is that imagination involves what Sartre calls "quasi-observation". In one sense, according to Sartre, one cannot "learn" anything from imagination; one puts into it exactly what one gets out of it. Whether the thesis is correct or not (Amy Kind, for example, has challenged it recently), it poses a problem for this proposal qua Sartre interpretation because, clearly, Sartre thinks our confrontation with the Other provides a basis for learning, perhaps surprisingly and frustratingly, what the Other in fact thinks of us. We don't just project that. For all that, the paper is well worth reading and is generally very insightful.

Various conflicting (and sometimes only apparently conflicting) accounts of the relationships between the manifold ways in which we present absent, different, potential, or contrary-to-fact perspectives to ourselves (in memory, planning, imagination, idealization, empathy, aesthetic experience, etc.) can be culled from this volume. Do we, properly speaking, imagine others when we engage intersubjective experience and cognition? Is this a kind of "simulation" of the other? Or is it more like a ToM -- a theory of mind that explains the observable in terms of the (in principle) unobservable? Or is this rather a sui generis kind of conscious experience in which we quasi-directly "see" the Other expressed in behavior, eyes, and face? Those familiar with the theory of mind vs. simulation debate as well as the phenomenology-inspired "direct perception" account of intersubjectivity (re-articulated recently by Dan Zahavi and others) will find much to chew on here. Those unfamiliar will, here again, find a nice introduction. Do we, properly speaking, imagine the unseen sides of objects as we navigate an environment or investigate some medium-size dry good, all the while retending its just-seen aspects and protending aspects to come? Famously, Husserl wanted to distance his account of these matters from the Kantian position on the role of the imagination in perception. While this is not a new thought, a reading of this book can cause one to be struck more by the similarity of the Husserlian and Kantian accounts than by their real differences.

Just this issue comes up strikingly in Section III in Anita Avramides' "The Minded Other and the Work of the Imagination". Drawing on P.F. Strawson's "Perception and Imagination", Avramides essentially reinvents one of the wheels in the phenomenological dialectic on this topic, though with an interesting twist that resonates well, in a curious way, with the idea proposed by Altobrando described above. If we take Strawson's Kant-inspired idea that the sort of imagination fused with normal perception allows us to perceptually experience what is absent (which, again, is arguably not really so different from Husserl's account of empty intending), then in experiencing your minded behavior I can experience you as, in effect, the emptily intended "principle of the series" (to borrow Sartre's borrowed locution) immanently expressed through but also transcendent to that observed behavior. This is not so different from the co-presentation view considered by Husserl and Stein (described above) and is one variation on the phenomenology-inspired direct perception view of intersubjectivity. The interesting twist turns on the fact that perception of some object (a tree, say) under a certain concept (seeing-as, if you prefer) makes a sort of reference, on the Kant-Strawson(-Husserl) position, to other instances of the same kind (to other trees). When I thus spontaneously "imagine" (or "co-present") you as I comprehendingly perceive your expressive behavior, I experience you as being another instance of the same kind as I -- an individual minded being with a point of view, token distinct from but type identical with me. For this to happen, I need to have something like a "concept" of, so to speak, variable individuality -- hence the connection to the Altobrando paper.

Matthew Ratcliffe's "Empathy Without Simulation", the last paper in Section III, is a valuable meditation on the nature of empathy informed by clinical practice in psychiatry (at least the classic tradition of psychiatry in which the psychiatrist actually listens to the patient and does not merely prescribe psychotropic drugs), counseling psychology, and related fields. These areas of practice develop and codify something that everyone who has ever been, or ever had a friend or family member who was, a "good listener" knows: empathy is in some ways more important in its openness to differences than in its similarity bases; and empathy, truly worthy of the name anyway, is a process that takes time, commitment, and involves give and take between the empath and the subject of his or her concern. That seems right to me, and Ratcliffe's discussion of these matters is subtle and well worth reading.

However, Ratcliffe deploys this deftness in the service of polemicizing against simulation theory, the view that we understand others by imaginatively projecting their shoes onto our own feet (properly reversing here the usual way of putting it). He begins with a fairly narrow formulation of simulation theory that makes his own preferences for how we use the word 'empathy' seem persuasive, but as the paper unfolds it begins to seem that he is more or less "straw manning" simulation theory in the following sense: simulation theory is a hypothesis about the basic structure of our intersubjective capacity, not, by itself, a model of complex elaborations of that capacity, elaborations like clinical empathic practice, for example. One can fault simulation theory for being too vague a hypothesis to do much explanatory work; but one certainly cannot deny (and Ratcliffe of course does not) that we do not begin as clinical empathizers and that such complex capacities depend on a much more basic kind of intersubjectivity or perspective-taking ability. That is what simulation theory is meant to address; whether it succeeds or not is another matter. But Ratcliffe's arguments against it fall rather flat, in my view. One can easily imagine a simulation theorist absorbing or countering all of Ratcliffe's arguments, once one realizes what was just pointed out. The value of the paper lies rather in its compelling exploration of clinical empathy.

The papers in Sections IV and V will be of great interest to those worried (and we should all be worried) about how whole societies or groupings within societies "take perspective" or form collective points of view. The papers, collectively, nicely bring once more to the fore the phenomenological strand in sociological thought (represented notably by Scheler, Schütz, and Gurwitsch), but one also finds relations to Anglo-American social philosophy, reminders of the existential-phenomenology-to-structuralism-to-post-structuralism dialectic, and much else besides.

The final contribution, in Section V, "The Ethico-Political Turn of Phenomenology: Reflections on Otherness in Husserl and Levinas" by Matthias Flatscher and Sergej Seitz is simultaneously one of the best brief overviews of Husserl's restless thinking on the problem of intersubjectivity and one of the best introductions to Emmanuel Levinas' radical reordering of phenomenological "first philosophy" this reviewer, at least, has ever read. While one may not be convinced that the Husserlian failure (if that's what it was) to make sense of the constitution of genuine intersubjectivity out of conscious subjectivity forces us to regard our confrontation with the other as an irreducible ethico-ontological inconcussum and to give pride of place to ethics and even politics over epistemology and metaphysics, one does get a good sense of the centrality and difficulty of the problem of intersubjectivity in the phenomenological tradition, as well as the profound humanity and almost Bodhisattva-like compassion that animated Levinas' regard. And that is something we could all use a good dose of these days.

The book is highly recommended.


Rudrauf, David, Daniel Bennequin, Isabela Granic, Gregory Landini, Karl Friston, and Kenneth Williford. "A mathematical model of embodied consciousness." Journal of theoretical biology 428 (2017): 106-131.

Smith, Joel. Experiencing phenomenology: An introduction. Routledge (2016).