Imagination and the Imaginary

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Kathleen Lennon, Imagination and the Imaginary, Routledge, 2015, 145pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415430920.

Reviewed by Jennifer A. Wagner-Lawlor, Pennsylvania State University


Kathleen Lennon's new monograph joins a growing number of studies reclaiming the imagination from the dominance of a rationalist positivism.It marks the steps that have brought us toward modern concepts of the imagination, the Imaginary, and both body and social imaginaries. With the concise declaration that "the imagination is that by which there is a world for us," Lennon conducts the reader from Hume's empiricism to Merleau-Ponty's restoration of the imagination and the imaginary, "without which we would never understand the quasi presence and imminent visibility which make up the whole problem of the imaginary" (p. 3, quoting Merleau-Ponty). The book's strength is the clarity of the conceptual history it lays out as it illuminates the complexity and conceptual resonances of "the imaginary texture of real" (p. 3). There is no oxymoron for Lennon in Merleau-Ponty's expression. The "richer reality" (p. 11, quoting John McDowell) that imagination makes possible is the conceptual domain Lennon will explore, relying on the discernments that phenomenology offers to an onto-epistemology of the imagination.

Chapters one and two lay out the historical and conceptual foundations of this book's construction of philosophical history. Opening with David Hume, Lennon maps out the rationale for, and the limitations of, that philosopher's eighteenth-century suspicion of mental images that could only be regarded as "a tracing, a copy, a second thing" (p. 3, quoting Merleau-Ponty). The secondariness of such images determines the sharp distinction between perception and imagination that characterizes Hume's empiricism and his deep distrust of "Fancy," or what Coleridge called the Primary Imagination. Hume uneasily acknowledges that the imagination, in making present images of absent things, plays a critical role in our capacity to remember, and to speculate. Yet he is at a loss to explain how a "solid" account of "the world, the actual" is to be derived from it: "I cannot conceive how such trivial qualities of the fancy, conducted by such false oppositions can ever lead to any solid or rational system" (p. 17, quoting Hume). Hume's ambivalence pinpoints a conceptual roadblock that Lennon looks to Kant (with a nod toward Coleridge), Sartre, Cornelius Castoriadis, and Merleau-Ponty to dismantle and clear away.

Lennon gives particular attention to Kant's "constitutive" linking of imagery with affect, returning "enchantment" into a "disenchanted world" stripped of spontaneity, creativity, and "a character" (p. 5) under the positivist regime. Reintroducing the significance of the world "as lived" through phenomenology, Lennon will focus on the process by which "a subject who exists within and alongside [the world]" discerns a "pattern of significance" that characterizes the world, for that individual; the" attunement" (8), she says, evoking metaphors of music and mechanism, of self to world. Cognition requires recognition of the joint role of physical perception and the imagining consciousness. Rather than eschew "unreal" or imaginary worlds we need to acknowledge that we actually (so to speak) live in one. Individual perception and construction of "the actual, the world," "has a salience and significance which renders [it] intelligible, makes sense of our responses to it" (p. 11). The sense-making operation is not reason's alone, but also imagination's, through a second-order operation that Coleridge identifies as "the secondary imagination."

The clarification of a primary and secondary imagination (to borrow the Romantic terminology) is a crucial advance in Lennon's history: "The dimension of creativity suggested by the claim that our world is an imaginary world allows for the possibility of it being imagined in different ways, being open to alternative visions" (p. 12). Only when the full force of the imagination works alongside the logic of reason are political aspiration, social transformation, utopian horizon-watching, and what we now call "worlding" even possible. Lennon endorses John McDowell's claim (in Mind and Matter) that the "second nature" that constitutes our construction of reality is necessarily creative. That creativity opens up "visions of" as well as agency within "a world in which [we] find more than what is open to view from . . . the natural sciences . . . And there is nothing against bringing this richer reality under the rubric of nature too" (p. 11, quoting McDowell). Lennon's restatement of McDowell emphasizes the productivity of this creative worlding: "The dimension of creativity suggested by the claim that our world is an imaginary world allows for the possibility of it being imagined in different ways, being open to alternative visions." (p. 12).

This "productive" quality of the imagination is explored more fully in chapter two ("Imagination and perception: the productive and reproductive imagination"), where the author outlines the revaluation of the imagination through Kant's notion of "synthesis." Hume's "simply associative" model of the imagination is rejected for a Kantian proposal that "any application of a concept requires a manifold" which the imagination, in association with rationality, will "synthesize" and thereby call into shape. This shaping of a manifold constitutes the distinctive activity of the "productive imagination" (p. 19), productive in that it is not simply mimetic, but creative. The mind's image-making power is not to be devalued as producing "irreal" or "illusory" perceptions and therefore "merely" fanciful worlds. The operation of the imagination is constitutive of reality itself. The "ontological and phenomenological 'dimensions' of the imaginary" enable various "modalities of sensory perception" (p. 133). These modalities of perception, which reason alone cannot offer, give "texture" to reality and, additionally, reality to our perception of the world's texture.

Chapter three ("Imagination and perception: the absent present and bodily synthesis") details what a new materialist might call the "entanglement" of world and flesh, self and other. A process of "bodily synthesis" is characterized by "reciprocity of touch" (p. 137) between self and non-self, mind and world, world and flesh.[i] Jean-Paul Sartre is introduced in this context, as Lennon reviews the analogon and other Sartrean notions in building out an account of "the perceptional ground which is surpassed in the creation of the image" (p. 35). Lennon approves this "surpassing," which creates the conceptual space for acknowledging the imagination as a necessary catalyst to both spontaneity and freedom (pp. 37-38). But as with Hume, Sartre's reluctance to give up the priority of perception means that he "fail[s] to accommodate our perceptual experiences and our experiences of agency." Sartre's "metaphysical underpinning" for phenomenology, argues Lennon, negates or empties out "imagining consciousness" (p. 44). Instead, Merleau-Ponty will posit the critical function of the imagination in mental operations that are "indispensable for the definition of Being itself." For Merleau-Ponty, she continues, "[manifest possibilities] are manifest only within the context of these projects. . . . all projects are anchored in the shape the world takes in our encounters with it" (p. 44). Therein lies, concludes Lennon, the "texture of perceptual experience," an "expressive depth," "'a certain manner of modulating time and space'" (p. 46).

The "affective character" of the texture of the real is the focus in chapter four ("An 'affective logic'"), which parses two important modalities of Affect: receptivity ("the capacity of our bodies to be affected") and spontaneity (or "the capacity to respond" (p. 52)). Here Lennon usefully draws on contributions of French psychoanalytic thought -- particularly Lacan's analysis of an "affective logic" that inheres in his notion of the Imaginary. Lennon clarifies the "character" of "the psychoanalytic imaginary" (p. 53) by setting Sartre's skepticism against Lacan's intricate structuring of affective identification. "The domain of the Imaginary, as the domain of experiencing ourselves, others, and the world at large in terms of images which carry affective charge" (p. 54) is crucial to Lennon's account. While acknowledging the usefulness of Sartre's notion of "affective-cognitive synthesis," Lennon wants to negate definitively Sartre's ambivalence toward the status of the mental image, and Merleau-Ponty's introduction of an affective logic helps to achieve that. Thinking about art, Lennon observes, "[Merleau-Ponty] does not describe or depict an already determinate reality, but as with other expressive gestures, brings a world into focus, opening a 'hollow' or 'fold' in existence . . . accomplishing the world alongside other expressive gestures" (p. 47). In this context, "pregnancy" recurs as a significant trope (mentioned on seven separate pages) the visible understood as "pregnant with the invisible . . . made manifest through the visible, giving it 'immense latent content of the past, the future and the elsewhere, which it announces and which it conceals" (p. 45).

Sartre's instrumentalist notion of art as simply signifying "prosaic things which are absent'" (p. 46, quoting Sartre) is therefore rejected for an "entangled" one, as we might say now; each of us is "creatively involved in bringing [the world] to expression, in gesture, in language, and in works of art" (p. 59). Furthermore the practice of art becomes an expression of "the world thinking itself" through the artist, the artist who recognizes patterns and unities, the texture of the real. The "work" of art is itself a gesture, through which an artist shares a particular complex experience of the world to a public, recreating for an engaged spectator or reader or listener the shape and affect of the artist's experience.

Chapter five broadens the previous chapter's emphasis on the interplay "between the cognitive and the affective" in "captur[ing] the impact that world has on us." From imagination's role in shaping individual experience, we turn to "imaginaries as features of socio-historical contexts which can be encountered and shared" (pp. 73-74): the shaping, in other words, of "imaginary institutions" (the chapter's title). Lennon begins at Castoriadis' correction of Kant's under-theorizing of "bodily and social aspects of the imagination." Placing Castoriadis into conversation with Merleau-Ponty on "the role the social plays in instituting our imaginaries," and with Marx on "imaginaries of the social," this chapter reviews the ways in which individual and social imaginaries can be understood as "both instituted ("passively found or encountered as conditions for experiencing the world"), and instituting ("actively and innovatively transformed as they are re-experienced" (p. 74)). Lennon sees Castoriadis and Merleau-Ponty in agreement on the openness of social institutions, at least theoretically; therein lies the possibility of social transformation, "the invitation to a future. Such an opening . . . is always a collective one, for the 'field' is always 'a double horizon' 'for others and not for me alone' [quoting Merleau-Ponty]" (p. 79). Castoriadis will critique Marxist theory as insufficiently attentive to the necessity of the imagination. Marx thereby hamstrings the revolutionary charge of his own theory, by discounting the productive aspect of imagination that makes alternative imaginaries possible.

This devaluing of imagination also accounts for inadequacies in Marx's handling of difference -- class difference, of course, but also, for later philosophers, race and gender. Moreover, alternative imaginaries offer the "sense" of difference that according to Merleau-Ponty is "by divergence, deformation [is] proper to institution" (p. 85, quoting Merleau-Ponty). The sense of difference makes available modes of divergence that insure freedom. These modes include critique (self-reflection, or reflection at the social level [87]); and demystification (88). Our capacity to see the texture of the real means that we also gain a kind of resiliency "even when [the imagination and its logic are] challenged by claims of truth or falsity" (89) in a particular ideological gestalt. Reflection, critique, demystification and resiliency will create, by opening up, the conceptual grounds for social movement aimed at challenging ossified ideological formations.

The remaining two chapters ("Imaginary selves" (Chapter six) and "Bodily imaginaries and the flesh of existence" (Chapter seven)) investigate the possibilities and implications of Lennon's description of "the apparatus of the imaginary":

Our world, including our social world, has a gestalt, interweaving the present and absent, echoing the past and the elsewhere, and holding our possibilities for the future. . . . Imaginaries are both encountered and modified in our ongoing, socially anchored interactions with the world and others. They are, in the terminology of the previous chapter, both instituted and instituting. (p. 96)

Following this framework, Lennon explores the role of the imaginary in the formation of individual and social change, as well as how "such identities are capable of reflective evaluation and change" (pp. 99-100). Chapter six focuses on Merleau-Ponty's arrival at "the metaphysical underpinning whereby the affective relation between the world and our bodies" (p. 134) as the definitive corrective to Sartre, because, she argues, Merleau-Ponty explicates how we can say that the imagination, too, "has the logic of internal relations" (p. 134). Where Sartre prioritizes rationality, which exerts itself in the world as "choice" and as freedom, Merleau-Ponty develops an ontology of the Flesh that provides the "logical" link between world and body as an affective relation (p. 134). Chapter seven focuses more on the social dimension of our "imaginary self" in relation to social imaginaries. The author is particularly attentive to various performative modes of being in the world -- particularly in the arts. Gustave Flaubert, Sartre, and Genet are exemplary; Sartre, Beauvoir, and Fanon merit discussion on the way toward Judith Butler, with a nod at Derrida, and Luce Irigaray. But as in previous chapters, the arc of argumentation will end at the "change of imaginaries" through several dimensions: the intersection of our "imaginaries of the body" with "our imaginaries of the world" (p. 132); the "mutual shaping" of one's own body and desire(s) with those of others; "the affective relation between the world and our bodies" experienced as a kind of sympathy (Merleau-Ponty's Einfuhling) that we can not only feel but express (p. 134). This will not, Lennon adds, reduce "the sensing and the sensible to a unitary sameness," a Kantian move that Lennon rejects. "It requires, rather than eliminates, difference and differentiation" (p. 134). By way of conclusion, the author adds that "We can think of imaginaries as the ways in which the world is lit up for us, ways which are open and infinite" (p. 139) -- and that we ourselves, in our perception of the everyday world, both admire that world best by expressing its form and its affect through our own actions and gestures, and through art.

Useful as this careful revaluation of the imagination and the imaginary is in creating our "textured" experience of the world, the reader may close the book unsatisfied. The absence of the most contemporary approaches to imagination studies -- in the fields of psychology, feminism, new materialist philosophy, ecopoetics and aesthetics -- is puzzling. Time and again the author turns away from the possibilities for advance offered by the very line of argumentation she follows. "This work will not directly address such concerns" (p. 3) and similar expressions, up to a final "We will not discuss this here" (p. 133), occur with noticeable regularity, at just those places where the author could reach forward toward the most contemporary deliberations and complications of the topic. Each time, the expression has the rhetorical effect of slamming on the brakes. We stop short, just when we thought the road would take us toward a new, or at least different, vista, maybe gaining a further horizon.

Given the author's history of work in feminism, the absence of a developed argument appraising contemporary feminist ontology and epistemology, and the emphasis on radical openness, is a disappointment. She misses opportunities in reading Merleau-Ponty to address contemporary feminists' insistence on a radical openness that is recently supported by feminist readings of Darwinism. Given Sartre's and Merleau-Ponty's interesting reference to "pregnancy" as a trope for thinking about the multivalent temporality "the world," the connection of this study to feminism seems too rich to leave to the side. So, too, with new materialist approaches that directly speak to the concerns of this work, but are not mentioned. The work of Claire Colebrook in particular springs first to mind, with its persistent focus on aesthetics and the material reality of the work of art created through the work of the imagination. Contemporary work in ecopoetics also challenges the relationship between human perceiver and nature in ways that relate to this study. Ecopoetics offers recalibrations of human and nonhuman agency in the world; ascribing agency even to living and nonliving organic materials that act upon us as much as we act upon them. Philosophers and artists have only begun to think about what visions and versions of a "textured reality" such ecopoetical imaginaries might offer.

Lennon might also have found support in current work in philosophical circles on neuroplasticity, particularly, given the attention she pays the French psychoanalytic philosophers, the work of Catherine Malabou, who extends some of the concepts outlined here and, supported by studies of neuroplasticity in humans, advances important claims about the ways neurophysiology can help to ground philosophical investigations into the mind, its moods, capacities, and affects, in "characterizing" the world. One could have hoped that the conclusion might have opened out toward some of the more provocative directions being taken by contemporary thinking on the imagination, particularly recent discussion regarding an "epistemology of imagination." Certainly this would have produced a longer book, but ultimately a more satisfying and adventurous one.

[i] The word "touch" may refer to more than the physical sense of touch. The etymology of "aesthetic" recalls the association of physical touching with emotion and affect, and therefore the production of and engagement with works of art (see p. 33).