Imagination in Kant's Critique of Practical Reason

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Bernard Freydberg, Imagination in Kant's Critique of Practical Reason, Indiana University Press, 2005, 180pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0253217873.

Reviewed by Lara Ostaric, St. Michael's College


In his book Imagination in Kant's Critique of Practical Reason, Freydberg offers three provocative arguments. First, Freydberg argues that even though the significance of imagination for practical reason is never mentioned by Kant, the role of this faculty in Kant's Critique of Practical Reason is central. Second, following Fichte, Schelling, and more recently Heidegger, he seeks to provide an account of the unity of the Kantian system. Freydberg argues that Kant's system owes its unity to the central role of imagination in Kant's philosophy as a whole. Third, guided by Kant's claims about the primacy of the practical, Freydberg argues that "the Critique of Practical Reason provides the linchpin of that unity" (p. 2).

The structure of Freydberg's work reflects his interest in the unity of the Kantian system. The aim of the Prologue and the Introduction is to suggest that the role of imagination in its "practical function" (p. 3) can already be identified in the first Critique. The main body of the text develops the theme of imagination's "practical function" in the second Critique. Finally, in the Epilogue Freydberg offers some insights on how the theme of imagination's "practical function" could also be developed in relation to Kant's reflective judgment.

Heidegger's influence on Freydberg's work can be discerned both with respect to its content and its style. Heidegger's influence on the content of Freydberg's book is evident in the significance Freydberg attributes to Kant's claim that imagination is a "common, but to us unknown root" of the two stems of human cognition, sensibility and understanding (A15, B29). Concerning Heidegger's influence on Freydberg's style, the terminology of "disclosure," "exhibiting imagination," imagination as "hidden" but "having always already been present," and "becoming manifest" is widespread in his book. In the Prologue, the Introduction and the Epilogue, where he treats imagination's "practical function" in the Critique of Pure Reason and the Critique of Judgment, Freydberg's fragmentary discussion of topics seems to be a part of his deliberate effort to let the centrality of imagination in Kant's work "be manifest" as opposed to demonstrated. His phenomenological approach to exhibiting the truth of some of his major interpretive claims is supplemented by a closer textual commentary of the second Critique in the work's main body and, in the footnotes, his engagement with both the analytic and continental Kant literature.

While Heidegger interpreted the history of Western philosophy through the lens of his own ontological project, German Idealists were interested in the "spirit" but not the "letter" of Kant's philosophy. In view of the influence on Freydberg's project of both Heidegger and the German Idealists, Freydberg's description of his goal as "modest, namely to get Kant right" (p. 20) inevitably raises suspicions in the reader.

These suspicions are already confirmed in the Prologue of the book where Freydberg argues that imagination "drives human knowledge" and "simultaneously limits this knowledge to those objects made possible by pure intuition, namely appearances" (p. 14). According to Freydberg, imagination is essential for the possibility of empirical knowledge because it provides schemata which connect concepts of the understanding to objects of possible experience given in sensible intuition. Freydberg further maintains that this role of imagination in connecting the categories to the objects of possible experience is also responsible for limiting knowledge to the realm of appearances, leaving the space open for the set of claims that can only be the subject of practical and not theoretical knowledge. Although for Kant imagination is the key faculty in transcendental deduction because it connects categories to the possible objects of experience, his argument for transcendental idealism does not amount just to this process. Kant's transcendental idealism is more complex in so far as it presupposes common objective experience, metaphysical and transcendental deductions of pure forms of experience and, what is most commonly left out by both post-Kantian idealists and some contemporary interpreters of Kant, the ideality of our pure forms of intuition of space and time. It is only after this third step that we can claim the non-spatiotemporal character of things in themselves and the fact that as such they cannot be the objects of theoretical knowledge. With such an interpretation of Kant's argument for transcendental idealism Freydberg follows in the footsteps of other post-Kantian foundationalists and their "short argument for idealism."[1]

By following his Leitfaden that imagination's synthesis of concepts and intuitions is the "'central nervous system' of the critical philosophy" (p. 4) that "beats at the heart of all three" Critiques (p. 5), Freydberg is led to make a series of strong claims that ascribe to imagination a major role whenever any activity of reason includes some form of synthesis. Thus, for example, Freydberg contends that reason's transcendental hypothesis by means of which a certain Idea of reason can be "thought problematically" (A771/B799) is the product of imagination because it presupposes imagination's synthesis. Moreover, on Freydberg's view, because "reason cannot generate any concept at all" (A 409/B436) the Ideas of reason in general and the Idea of freedom in particular are "the pure product of imagination" (p. 32). According to Freydberg, these examples prove that already in the first Critique imagination is responsible for the "creation of the practical realm itself" (p. 27). Freydberg, however, fails to attend to the fact that the formation of transcendental hypothesis is conducted "under the strict oversight of reason" (A770/B798) in order to ensure that, even though Ideas have no objects in experience, these objects are not "empty figments of the brain" [Hirngespinste] (A770/B798). Furthermore, the formation of Ideas clearly takes place in accordance with the following principle of reason: "If the conditioned is given, then the whole sum of conditions, and hence the absolutely unconditioned, is also given, through which alone the conditioned was possible" (A409/B436). This is why for Kant Ideas are transcendent concepts "we can never project in an image" (A328/B385); they are "grounded in the nature of human reason" (A323/B380) rather than in the imagination.

In Part One of his book, Analytic of Pure Practical Reason, Freydberg advances his major thesis, which is that imagination's practical function in the second Critique consists in building a bridge between the intelligible and the sensible realms. Freydberg argues that imagination mediates "the descent from the law of reason to the faculty of desire" (p. 50) in its creation of maxims. Because maxims are synthetic judgments, he argues that they presuppose the work of imagination. Moreover, Freydberg contends that this "descent" is also facilitated by the typic of pure practical judgment which also presupposes the work of imagination (even though Kant explicitly denies this). Finally, Freydberg argues that imagination connects the sensible and the intelligible realms by serving as the main author of the feeling of respect due to which we recognize the moral law as binding not only intellectually but also sensibly. Even though Kant acknowledges the importance of relating the moral law to the realm of experience, nonetheless, the fact that the formulation of maxims and the typic presuppose synthetic judgments does not sufficiently warrant Freydberg's claim that imagination has a major role in the enactment of the moral law in practice. Kant indeed refers to the typic as "the schema of the moral law" (V, 69), but his aim here is not to suggest that the typic is a product of imagination. The typic represents the relationship between the moral law and the will in terms of the law of nature and its object (i.e., objects of experience). Thus, Kant refers to the typic as a "schema" of the moral law because the typic connects something that is supersensible to the world of experience just like the schema of imagination connects concepts of the understanding to the sensible intuition given in experience. "Without these precautions" -- that is, without thinking of the supersensible as capable of being applied by our reason to the world of experience -- "we would be unable to make any use whatsoever of such a concept, and would indulge in fantasy instead of thinking" (VIII, 136). Freydberg evokes the synthesis of imagination in Kant's transcendental deduction and its role in connecting the spontaneity of the understanding and the receptivity of sensible intuition in order to support his claim that imagination has a similar function in producing the feeling of respect by connecting the spontaneity of the moral law and the receptivity of the moral feeling. (p. 87) This interpretation, however, can hardly find any support in the text. The necessary a priori connection between the moral law and the feeling of respect is due to the fact that the feeling of respect is not a pathological feeling caused by the object of the senses but, rather, it is "possible through a preceding (objective) determination of the will" (V, 81). In other words, the feeling of respect is a necessary consequence of moral judgment.

In Part Two, Dialectic and Methodology of Pure Practical Reason, Freydberg maintains that Kant's notion of the highest good functions as a "schema-analogon" that "allows the manifold of the satisfaction of human desires to be brought to (proportionate unity) under the moral law" (p. 100). Freydberg is right to argue that the highest good is analogous to the schema of imagination because for Kant the highest good is the representation of the world (i.e., the object of theoretical philosophy) as consistent with the ends demanded by the moral law (i.e., the object of practical philosophy). But on Freydberg's view, the highest good is also a direct product of imagination because the necessary connection between virtue and happiness in the Idea of the highest good is a synthetic a priori. Freydberg, however, fails to emphasize that this synthesis is, again, driven by the need of reason that "seeks the unconditioned totality of the object of pure practical reason" (V, 108). Similarly, according to Freydberg, the postulates of practical reason are also the products of a synthesis and, hence, they presuppose the work of imagination. But the postulates are the necessary conditions for the existence of the highest good and are demanded by the truth of the moral law. If the moral law commands us to promote that which we are not able to achieve, we will regard the law as "fantastic [phantastisch] and directed to empty imaginary ends" and as "in itself false" (V, 114).

Freydberg insightfully interprets Kant's understanding of the human condition as "ecstatic" (p. 119) that is, as "fragmented, finite" (p. 41) and constantly faced with the need for and the possibility of choosing the infinite. According to Freydberg, the Methodology of Pure Practical Reason exhibits this ecstatic human condition as it discusses

a gradual redirection of the imagination away from actual images to the pure, ruling image in terms of which the human being can enact her or his unique human life, or 'unique phenomenon'. (p. 121)

On Freydberg's view, imagination is responsible for the moral agent's projection of his or her own noumenal nature when faced with a concrete instance of virtue. But, according to Kant, this change of moral orientation and the cultivation of a moral character must be accomplished "by a dry and earnest representation of duty" (V, 157) which serves as an occasion for the exercise of moral judgment. This continual exercise of moral judgment will gradually increase the moral agent's awareness of his or her own capacity to act morally.

The topic of imagination's practical function has a lot of potential for illuminating the complex relation between our concrete human situation and our moral aspirations. This topic also has a lot of potential for exploring imagination's special role in building a unity between theoretical and practical reason. Freydberg's thesis, however, that for the practical function of imagination we should primarily look in the Critique of Practical Reason remains ultimately unconvincing. It is not imagination that is the "driver of practical reason" (p. 132) but rather it is reason that employs imagination towards the satisfaction of its own need.

For imagination's unique practical function one must instead turn to Kant's account of aesthetic judgment in the third Critique. The harmony of the cognitive faculties is something that both determinative and aesthetic judgments share. But the free harmony of the cognitive faculties in aesthetic judgment is very special. This is not because, as Freydberg suggests in the Epilogue, aesthetic judgment does not use any concept. (p. 146) It is rather that the wealth of imagination in aesthetic judgment offers something that goes beyond the mere concepts:

In an aesthetic respect, however, the imagination is free to provide, beyond that concord with the concept, unsought [ungesucht] extensive undeveloped material for the understanding, of which the latter took no regard in its concept. (KdU, AA V, 317)

Our employment of aesthetic judgment (and the wealth of imagination it presupposes) in responding to and creating beauty contributes to the unity of subjectivity. That is, our reception and creation of beauty contributes to the harmony of our sensible and supersensible nature as it "makes possible a transition from sensible charm to the habitual moral interest without too violent a leap" (KdU, AA V, 354). In other words, in aesthetic judgment one experiences a contemplative condition of the free harmony of the faculties that is free of the coercion of the senses. According to Kant, one's capacity to elevate oneself from the coercion of sensibility in aesthetic experience serves as a preparation for determining one's will in accordance with the moral law independent of any demands of our sensibility. Furthermore, our employment of aesthetic judgment contributes to the unity of subjectivity and external nature. That is, the occurrences of natural beauty and the works of a genius in the world serve as signs that the world is hospitable to our moral ends and that the realization of our moral vocation in such a world may indeed be possible. Thus, for the practical role of imagination in connecting the sensible and the intelligible realm we should look into these contingent occurrences of beauty in the world and our capacity to respond to them. It is also Kant's account of imagination in the aesthetic judgment that inspired German Idealists to search for an account of "self-orientation" which transcends the Kantian dualism between spontaneity and receptivity.[2]

[1] See Karl Ameriks, Kant and the Fate of Autonomy: Problems in the Appropriation of the Critical Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 2000, Ch. 2 and 3.

[2] I am thankful to Michael Olson for comments.