Immanuel Kant: Key Concepts

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Will Dudley and Kristina Engelhard (eds.), Immanuel Kant: Key Concepts, Acumen, 2011, 237pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844652396.

Reviewed by Melissa M. Merritt, University of New South Wales


This book is a collective commentary that aims to provide an accessible introduction to Kant's critical-period philosophy. As such, it falls into a growing genre, in which the work of an important figure in the history of philosophy is parcelled out among contemporary experts for discussion and interpretation. But because the present volume is evidently more oriented towards students, it is less scholarly than other works in the same genre, such as the three volumes devoted to Kant in the Cambridge Companion series or Graham Bird's A Companion to Kant.[1]

Indeed, a driving desideratum of the work seems to be to avoid getting bogged down in fine points of interpretation. While this is appropriate given the intended audience of the work, at times some contributors take this too far. This is particularly evident in the editors' general introduction, which situates Kant in the broader historical and philosophical context. For example, Dudley and Engelhard present Hume as an anti-enlightenment thinker (5) and a causal determinist (6), as if these were perfectly obvious and uncontested interpretive claims. They also somewhat carelessly remark that Kant's critical philosophy led to "the collapse of rationalism" (9). Maybe so, if the distinguishing mark of rationalism is the claim that we can have "epistemic access to things in themselves, the soul, the universe or God" (9) -- but I doubt that rationalism is helpfully glossed in such terms, or that Kant really managed to destroy rationalism in any historical or philosophical sense. Another piece of misleading shorthand is the editors' claim that maxims are intentions. On the face of it, at least, an intention must be held self-consciously. Yet according to Kant, our actions express maxims -- the rules or general policies on which we act -- whether we are aware of those maxims or not.[2] This is not a fussy or an arcane issue that we can profitably avoid, since it figures prominently in the Kantian account of how we can be held responsible for what we do.

The rest of the volume, after the general introduction, is divided into three parts corresponding to the topics arising in each of the three Critiques. Günter Zöller provides a general introduction to the first part, on Kant's theoretical philosophy, and at the same time addresses the broader significance of Kant's critical philosophy in overview. Zöller is extremely clear in explaining the methodological lesson that Kant claims to learn from the successful sciences (mathematics and physics), and insightful about the philosophical significance of Kant's "Copernican revolution" with regard to the aims of metaphysics -- without it, metaphysics could consist in nothing more than the analysis of concepts (23). Yet Zöller also papers over real interpretive controversies in his discussion of the various conceptions of knowledge at issue in the Critique -- and he does so, astonishingly, without providing the citations that would enable inquiring readers to sort the issues out for themselves.

As Zöller rightly points out, Kant distinguishes between Erkenntnis and Wissen. Zöller presents Erkenntnis as the more general term, referring to "knowledge claims of all kinds and any possible extent, regardless of whether they turn out, upon closer inspection, to be justified or unjustified"; Wissen, on the other hand, refers specifically to "cognitions claimed and proven to possess justification and truth" (15). But, as Zöller hints, there is more to Wissen than this: Wissen is roughly equivalent to scientific knowledge in the early-modern sense, which entails having the hallmarks of necessity and apodictic certainty. Thus it is not unreasonable for Zöller to claim that Kant is more interested in Wissen than Erkenntnis, given the broader aim of the Critique to put metaphysics on the "secure path of a science".[3] Yet in saying this, it is hard to see how Zöller can avoid wading into precisely the sort of "partisan interpretation" that he expressly set out to avoid (13). The Critique of Pure Reason was traditionally interpreted in the Anglo-American tradition as offering what is sometimes called a "metaphysics of experience". Although this line has been somewhat superseded by more historically sensitive approaches, it continues to inform much work on Kant. It of course entails placing special emphasis on Kant's conception of experience as empirical cognition -- Erkenntnis[4] -- and hence raises questions about the innocence of Zöller's claim that Kant cares more about Wissen.

The other chapters on Kant's theoretical philosophy follow the main divisions of the Critique of Pure Reason. Emily Carson contributes the chapter on sensibility, beginning with an interesting discussion of Kant's pre-critical view, before providing an overview of the Critique's Transcendental Aesthetic. Dietmar Heidemann has the daunting task of providing an overview of the entire Transcendental Analytic; his knack for finding simple examples helps to ease the journey. Yet the non-specialist reader might have been better served by a more selective treatment. There is a lot to be said, for example, about what exactly a "transcendental deduction" is supposed to be, and why Kant takes the Deduction of the Categories to be the indispensable fulcrum on which the weight of the Critique rests. As it stands, Heidemann's remark that the Deduction is an "enormous philosophical achievement" (58) is underwhelming, because not enough is said about the nature of the beast.

Michelle Grier provides an excellent discussion of the general aims, scope, and structure of the Transcendental Dialectic, followed by a closer look at the Antinomies of Pure Reason. There are many good reasons for focusing on the Antinomies, rather than the other chapters of the Dialectic, and my only complaint is that Grier should have explained this to the reader. After all, the antinomies and David Hume jointly aroused Kant from his "dogmatic slumber".[5] Hence the Antinomies chapter of the Critique is essential for understanding the impetus, and guiding ideas, of the work as a whole. Explaining this might have been illuminating for the non-specialist reader.

The second part of the book focuses on various topics in Kant's practical philosophy. It opens with Paul Guyer's excellent discussion of freedom and the will. Guyer deftly steers between the Scylla of misleading oversimplification and the Charybdis of technical detail. His account revolves around showing that, for Kant, "morality consists in freeing ourselves from the domination of inclination" (88). This thesis provides a guide to the coherence of Kant's ethics from his pre-critical work, through the critical period, and on to the late Religion within the Bounds of Mere Reason and Metaphysics of Morals. Along the way, Guyer provides an elegant and insightful account of how the three main formulations of the categorical imperative relate to one another.

Kenneth Westphal follows with an account of the categorical imperative from another angle, now taking up Kant's procedure for universalizing maxims in order to determine our moral duties. Westphal's account of this ought to have been clearer: it was particularly difficult to track his suggestions about how the procedure needs to be modified in order to avoid yielding trivial pseudo-duties.[6] Georg Mohr and Ulli Rühl follow with a discussion of the place of Kant's notion of right in his broader moral philosophy.

Katrin Flikschuh's chapter, on Kant's political philosophy, is another highlight of the book: aside from providing an accessible account of the coherence of Kant's political philosophy across the Metaphysics of Morals and the popular "On Perpetual Peace", it also contains a fascinating reading of how Kant "schematizes" his initial argument about rights relations through its application to empirical space (i.e., the spatial limits determined by the curvature of the earth).

The third section of the book initially follows the structure of the Critique of Judgment: Kirk Pillow discusses the judgment of taste (more or less passing over the aesthetic judgment of the sublime), and John Zammito takes up teleological judgment. Pillow does a good job of keeping the non-specialist reader in view, particularly through his sensible discussion of the notion of an "interest", and hence in turn the "disinterested" nature of our enjoyment of beauty. He also points out some of the ways in which twentieth-century art criticism drew upon Kant's aesthetics to develop a formalist theory of painting. But neither Pillow nor Zammito are sufficiently clear about the crucial notion of reflection. Pillow suggests that what makes the judgment of taste "reflective" is that it involves feeling (155-6) -- when this in fact only explains what makes the judgment aesthetic. Zammito, on the other hand, implies that "reflective" can be glossed as "regulative" (171). Perhaps some attention to the unpublished "First Introduction" to the Critique of Judgment might have helped, since there the judgment of taste is glossed as the "aesthetic judgment of reflection" (e.g., at 20:224). With this in mind it is possible to distinguish between the aesthetic character of the judgment of taste -- i.e., that beauty is appreciated through feeling -- from its reflective character -- i.e., that it is a mode of judgment which renders thematic the mind's awareness of itself. Stephen Houlgate provides a surprising final chapter, which examines how the idea of the purposiveness of nature further informs Kant's philosophy of history.

On the whole, the editors should have done more to unify the book. It would have been helpful if thematic links were drawn between the various chapters in the part on Kant's theoretical philosophy. For example, Carson's discussion of the evolution of Kant's views about space and time might have been linked back to Zöller's piece, or forward to Grier's, in order to show how Kant aims to draw upon transcendental idealism in order to resolve the problem of metaphysics. The second part of the book, on Kant's practical philosophy, is marred by too much overlap between the various chapters: more should have been done to reduce such overlap (especially on the organization of the Metaphysics of Morals, which is covered in detail twice). At the same time, much more should have been said about the Kantian conception of virtue, which was sadly neglected in comparison.

Given the title, Immanuel Kant: Key Concepts, I expected something other than a collective commentary following the divisions of Kant's major works. I expected, rather, a commentary organized around fundamental concepts that are not neatly tied to any particular corner of Kant's thought: examples might include "enlightenment", "freedom and spontaneity", "human nature", and "virtue". What I found instead was a somewhat predictable instance of a now-familiar genre. But must we follow the organization of Kant's corpus so slavishly? Perhaps a collective commentary organized along the alternative lines I suggest might provide a platform both for an accessible introduction to Kant, as well as for new ways of thinking about the enduring power of Kant's critical philosophy as a whole.

[1] Paul Guyer, ed., Cambridge Companion to Kant (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992); Paul Guyer, ed., Cambridge Companion to Kant and Modern Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006); Paul Guyer, ed., Cambridge Companion to the Critique of Pure Reason (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010); Graham Bird, ed., A Companion to Kant (Malden, MA and Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 2006).

[2] For recent accounts of why maxims cannot be identified with intentions, see Onora O'Neill, Constructions of Reason (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989), 150-51; and Stephen Engstrom, The Form of Practical Knowledge: A Study of the Categorical Imperative (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2009), 20, 32, 61 and passim.

[3] Critique of Pure Reason, Bxviii. References to the Critique of Pure Reason follow the pagination of the first (A) and second (B) editions of the text. References to Kant's other works follow the volume and page of the German Academy of Sciences edition.

[4] Kant says "Empirical cognition [Erkenntnis] is experience" (B165-6), although he presumably means that experience is a mode of empirical cognition (see B1).

[5] See Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics, Preface 4:260 and §50, 4:338.

[6] Westphal also orients his discussion around John Stuart Mill's remarks on Kant, without explaining why. Presumably the intention was to render Kant's ethics more accessible by linking it to something that is -- at least to many readers -- more familiar. Yet as it stands, the continual glances to Mill are distracting.