Immanuel Kant's Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals: A Commentary

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Dieter Schönecker and Allen W. Wood, Immanuel Kant's Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals: A Commentary, Nicholas Walker (tr.), Harvard University Press, 2015, 236pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674430136.

Reviewed by Andrews Reath, University of California, Riverside


This volume is a slightly revised translation of a commentary on the Groundwork that Dieter Schönecker and Allen W. Wood published in German in 2001. Schönecker and Wood stress that it is a joint product that is independent of the earlier work of each individual author, but readers familiar with their other work will recognize the influence of Wood's views about the Categorical Imperative (CI) on their treatment of Groundwork II and of Schönecker's account of the structure of the deduction of the CI on their treatment of Groundwork III. It is an excellent, short (as they intend it to be) commentary. Their aim is an accurate reading that pays close attention to textual details -- including the structure of individual sentences and paragraphs that are hard to parse and often misread. Schönecker and Wood aim to explain exactly what Kant is saying throughout the Groundwork. And while they are sympathetic to Kant, they don't hesitate to point out features of his argument that they find unsatisfactory. The four chapters of the book cover the Preface and each of the three Sections of the Groundwork, and each chapter ends with a summary of the main interpretive points as well as the weaknesses that they see in Kant's argument.

Schönecker and Wood intend their commentary "for the beginning student" as an aid to initial study of the Groundwork but "hope that scholars may also profit from it." (x) Their beginning students must be more advanced than mine; while their commentary contains ample citation and analysis of many important passages, it seems to me to presuppose general overall familiarity with the Groundwork and some of its interpretive problems. But I did profit from reading it, as will advanced undergraduates, graduate students and scholars. It is an important commentary, and I recommend it to anyone with a serious interest in the Groundwork. In this review I shall highlight some of their distinctive interpretive theses. (I find many, though not all, persuasive, but detailed discussion is beyond the scope of this short review.)

The chapter on the Preface argues that the distinction between the analytic and synthetic portions of the Groundwork (G I and II are engaged in analysis of concepts, while the "deduction" of the CI in G III employs a synthetic use of reason) does not map onto the distinction between the analytic and synthetic methods that Kant describes in the Prolegomena. Rather Kant's "method" in the Groundwork is to be understood in terms of the "transitions" between different forms of cognition that occur in its three Sections, described by Kant in the last paragraph of the Preface (G 392: 17-28).[1] Schönecker and Wood give a helpful discussion of what these transitions are (6-9) as well as what Kant means by the "common rational moral cognition" from which Groundwork I proceeds. Their treatment of the idea of a "metaphysics of morals" (one key idea introduced in the Preface) points out certain respects in which Kant's project in the Groundwork assumes an empirical theory of human nature, though not in a way that undermines his a priori foundational project. For example, Kant's claims about the practical importance of a pure moral philosophy (that without it "morals themselves remain subject to all sorts of corruption" (G 390: 1-2)) presupposes "the anthropological thesis that human beings are massively exposed to the corrupting influence of nature." (31; cf. 15-16.)

The chapter on Groundwork I focuses on Kant's claims about the unconditioned value of the good will and how they lead to the concept of duty (G 393-6), the "three propositions" that drop out of Kant's analysis of the concept of duty (G 397- 401), and Kant's initial derivation of a statement of the CI (at G 402-3). The longest part of the chapter is a detailed interpretive discussion of the three propositions and how they are related to each other. That is a good choice since the point of the examples of action done from duty in the middle of Groundwork I is to launch an argument to the initial statement of the CI, and the three propositions are the basis of this argument. The three propositions also present the reader with several puzzles: what is the first proposition (not explicitly stated by Kant), what exactly does the third proposition mean (that "duty is the necessity of an action from respect for the law"), and how it is a "consequence of both preceding" propositions (G 400: 17-18)? The aim to make sense of this last point drives their interpretation. A standard reading of the unstated first proposition is that an action has moral worth when done from duty. Schönecker and Wood instead take it to concern the subjective (motivational) dimension of action from duty -- that actions from duty are done from respect for the moral law. The second principle concerns the objective dimension of action from duty -- that it is done on a necessary principle required by morality. The third proposition follows by combining the subjective dimension (respect for morality) and the objective dimension of action from duty (action on a necessary principle). There are, of course, other ways to read this sequence, and their proposal will be debated, but it has the virtue of taking seriously Kant's claim that the third proposition in some sense follows from or combines the first two. Schönecker and Wood argue that Kant's subsequent initial derivation of the CI at G 402-3 is "highly problematic" (90) because it places too much emphasis on "mere lawfulness" or "conformity to law as such" and takes this formal property to be a sufficient basis for the fundamental moral principle without the need to introduce any substantive moral value (such as respect for human dignity). This assessment is of a piece with their view, developed in the next chapter, that the heart of Kant's moral theory is the Formula of Humanity (FH) and the idea of autonomy rather than the Formula of Universal Law (FUL).

The chapter on Groundwork II covers all its main themes, and I shall simply enumerate several of their interpretive points. Happiness (as the overall satisfaction of all present and future needs (112)) is "a normative a priori principle of prudential reason . . . an aim that reason sets for us" (114, 115). There is a complicated discussion of the possibility of hypothetical imperatives that distinguishes the hypothetical imperative from a descriptive principle of fully rational willing that Schönecker and Wood call the "ends-mean proposition" (116) (that "whoever wills the end, also wills the means (insofar as reason has decisive influence on his actions)" (G 417: 8)). (I don't see a deep distinction here, but I agree with their view that both principles hold that in setting an end one directs oneself to pursue the means.) (117-22) Much of the discussion of the different formulas of the CI will be familiar to readers who know Wood's earlier work on the subject. The core of Kant's normative theory is not the formal idea of universalizability but rather the substantive value of persons as ends in themselves. Schönecker and Wood argue that the FUL is not adequate as a statement of the CI by laying out the usual worries. At best it assesses the permissibility of maxims and does not generate any substantive moral principles, but even here there are false negatives and false positives, and the distinction between contradiction in conception and contradiction in will does not track the distinction between perfect and imperfect duties as Kant intends. (130-141) FUL is a preliminary statement of the CI with the limited use of showing an agent that a proposed maxim violates a principle that she otherwise accepts (139), where such principles are grounded in FH (142, 165). Schönecker and Wood argue that what makes human beings ends in themselves is not the capacity to set ends but rather autonomy, understood as "the capacity to establish and to observe moral laws", which itself is based on freedom (145, 146) -- though Kant never makes clear how exactly this argument is supposed to go. (147) (That freedom makes agents end in themselves is supported by remarks in Kant's Introduction to the Naturrecht Feyerabend, though it should be noted that interpreters who take the distinguishing mark of humanity to be the capacity to set ends for oneself regard it as a capacity that presupposes freedom.) The value-based nature of Kant's conception makes him a moral realist, not a constructivist. (148)

Though FH states the core of Kant's normative theory, Kant's attempts to derive specific duties from it is not without problems since no clear criterion of whether a particular action respects the humanity of those affected as an end in itself can be drawn from Kant's examples. (Schönecker and Wood suggest that to fully interpret FH, Kant needs to appeal to a set of values that can only be given through feeling:

that there are values is something that we can understand only if we experience them. The assertion that 'human beings have absolute worth or value' would be entirely meaningless for us if we did not experience values (noncognitively) or somehow know what they are. (156))

Schönecker and Wood argue that the Formula of Autonomy (FA) is a more complete formulation of the CI in that it "embraces the FUL and the FH within itself". (159, here following G 431: 14-18) Further, it is a stronger criterion than FUL since it prescribes a set of binding moral principles. A "'universally legislative' . . . will . . . must positively prescribe how we ought to act." (159; cf. 174) (Kant does not illustrate FA with examples as he does FUL and FH, but still I wish that Schönecker and Wood had said more about how they think one might use FA to arrive at substantive moral principles.) One issue that has arisen in recent scholarship is whether the "universal formula" of the CI to which Kant refers in the summary of the argument at G 436: 31 should be identified with the Formula of Universal Law or with the Formula of Autonomy. Schönecker believes that Kant is referring to the FUL, while Wood thinks that he means the FA. One nice feature of their discussion is that rather than try to resolve this issue, the authors give the arguments on each side and leave the matter for the reader to resolve.

Schönecker and Wood's commentary on Groundwork III is as good a treatment of the overall argument as there is. By staying very close to the text, it offers many insights about the structure of Kant's deduction of the categorical imperative, the tasks of the different subsections of the chapter (which claims are established at what points, which left open, etc.), the transitions between the different subsections, and so on. It also identifies the serious challenges to making philosophical sense of the argument. I shall focus on their accounts of Kant's famous claim that "a free will and a will under moral laws are one and the same", (G 447: 6-7) which they call the "Analyticity Thesis", and of the key move in Kant's deduction of the CI.

Where Kant draws the line within his pure moral philosophy between what is analytic and what is synthetic a priori is one of the more confusing elements of the Groundwork. He is very clear that the authority of the CI for human agents is synthetic a priori. But formulations of the CI are derived analytically in Groundwork I and II (from analysis of ordinary moral concepts, including the concept of a good will (G 437), from the nature of practical reason, etc.), the preliminary arguments of Groundwork III (from rationality to freedom, from freedom to morality) appear analytic, and formulations of the CI that are very similar are presented as analytic in some places but as synthetic a priori in others (compare G 437: 6-10 with G 447: 11-13). One standard way to sort this out is to hold that while mere statements of either the moral law or the CI are analytically derivable (leaving aside the issue of their normative authority), the assertion of either as an authoritative normative principle is synthetic a priori. On this approach, Kant's thesis that a free will stands under moral laws follows from an analysis of the concept of freedom, and it holds for any free will, both perfectly rational and imperfectly rational, sensuously-affected wills. Showing that we may ascribe freedom to ourselves involves synthetic claims about the human will and is no easy task. But once accomplished, it is a short step from the claim that a free will stands under moral laws to the authority of the CI for human agents.

Schönecker and Wood argue that the "free will" that is "under moral laws" is the perfectly free will or the will of a sensuously-affected rational agent insofar as he wills what is good and fully conforms to reason. That is, this claim is not intended to apply to finite human wills that imperfectly conform to reason and morality. Further, they argue that the moral law is analytic for a perfectly free will (by which I take it they mean that the validity of this principle is analytic):

Hence for a perfectly rational being the moral law is an analytic, or a merely descriptive, proposition. It is analytic because it follows from the analysis of the concept of the freedom of a purely rational will that this latter wills the good; it is descriptive because the proposition 'A perfectly rational will always wills the good' just describes such a purely rational will. (181)

That means that the Analyticity Thesis that a free will is under moral laws and the ascription of freedom to the finite human will do not suffice to establish the authority of the CI for us. And indeed, in support of Schönecker and Wood's reading, the "deduction" proper of the CI (453: 17 - 454: 19) requires further steps after Kant has argued that we are warranted in ascribing freedom to our wills (at G 452: 31 -- 453: 15). On their view the synthetic a priori status of the CI is due to its imperatival form and to the fact that the purely rational will adds something to our wills as sensuously-affected. (109)

In ascribing freedom to our wills, we self-ascribe a purely rational capacity that makes us members of the intelligible world. Simply as such (i.e., if the pure will exhausted our faculty of desire), our willing would invariably conform to the moral law. But we are also sensuously-affected agents with an interest in happiness, thus members of the sensible world. The final move in Kant's argument for the validity of the moral law for us as a categorical imperative depends on the claim that "the world of understanding contains the ground of the world of sense, and hence also of its laws" (G 453: 31-2), plus related claims about the authentic self (G 457: 34, 458: 2, 461: 4). Schönecker and Wood term this principle "Kant's onto-ethical principle" and conclude:

Kant grounds the validity of the CI on the superior ontological status of the world of the understanding . . . The human being as a thing in itself (and thereby as 'authentic self') enjoys a higher ontological significance than the human being as appearance, and that is why the law of the world of the understanding is valid as an imperative for the human being who is at the same time a member of the world of sense. (209)

This may well be what Kant actually thought in the Groundwork, but unfortunately it makes nonsense of his deduction of the categorical imperative, and Schönecker and Wood point out several problems in the argument. (One is that it leaves it unclear whether bad actions may be ascribed to an agent's free will, in which case we would not be responsible for bad choice. But there are various ways to avoid saddling Kant with this problem -- for example, by taking free agency to be a rational capacity that we exercise imperfectly and making responsibility depend simply on possession of the capacity.) But at the same time, Schönecker and Wood credit Kant with the "moral insight" that the validity of the CI depends on the fact that it is a principle that we authentically will for ourselves, and this idea is what may be salvaged from his argument. (212)

Two brief comments: the move from freedom to morality at G 446-7 is clearly analytic, but I am not convinced that that makes the validity of the moral law analytic for a purely free will or a finite will qua acting rationally. However, I don't have an account of how the moral law (in its non-imperatival form) might be a synthetic a priori principle, and Schönecker and Wood may indeed be right.[2] Second, I would like to think that there is a way of reading Kant's deduction of the CI that does not make it depend on a strong ontological principle. For example, Kant's references to the authentic self might be unpacked through the idea that we identify with our freedom and rationality as those capacities in virtue of which we have a self, where the notion of identification is normative and not ontological -- but then the burden is to work out that alternative reading.

[1] Citations to the Groundwork (G) are to page and line number of the Berlin Academy edition.

[2] For a helpful critical discussion of Schönecker's development of the "Analyticity Thesis", see Henry E. Allison, Kant's Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals: A Commentary (Cambridge University Press, 2011), Chapter 10.