Immanuel Kant: The Very Idea of a Critique of Pure Reason

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J. Colin McQuillan, Immanuel Kant: The Very Idea of a Critique of Pure Reason, Northwestern University Press, 2016, 176pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810132481.

Reviewed by Riccardo Pozzo, National Research Council of Italy


On top of being an excellent dissertation defended at Emory under the direction of Rudolf Makkreel, which is already a sound recommendation for outstanding philosophical-historical work, this book profited from a substantial stay at the University of Halle, where the author was a guest of Jürgen Stolzenberg. With a great deal of research, J. Colin McQuillan has demonstrated mastery not only over Kant's own project and texts, but to a certain extent also over the milieu to which he belonged. It's not surprising that this erudite and seminal work of meticulous scholarship adds something new to our understanding of Kant's conception of critique.

McQuillan's objective is to reconstruct the different ways the concept of critique was used during the eighteenth century, the relationship between Kant's critique and his pre-critical experiments with different approaches to metaphysics, the varying definitions of a critique of pure reason Kant offers in the prefaces and introductions to the first Critique, and the way Kant responds to objections. The core of his research, it seems to me, aims at answering the following question: when Kant started to work on the first Critique, what kind of discipline did he want to contribute to?

Initial attention is being paid obviously to the celebrated but quite seldom read work of 1762 by Henry Home, Lord Kames, Elements of Criticism, which as Norman Kemp Smith claimed, could have been the source of Kant's conception of critique.[1] McQuillan rejects this option. Quoting the Jäsche Logik [KgS 9:15] he points out:

It is important to remember that when Kant discusses the critique of taste during the pre-critical period, he is almost always highlighting the difference between the merely empirical standards of taste and the rational principles of sciences like logic and metaphysics. This is apparent from Kant's logic lectures, where he frequently draws a contrast between aesthetics and logic when he wants to explain why logic is a science. Kant argues that logic is a science because it is based on rational principles that are established independently of experience. Aesthetics cannot be a science because it "derives its rules a posteriori" and "only makes more universal, through comparison, the empirical laws according to which we cognize the more perfect (beautiful) and the more imperfect." (p. 12)

The preference for the Jäsche Logik and for Kant's printed works as opposed to an indeed parsimonious consideration of Kant's own manuscripts and the various elaborations of his lecture materials makes it clear from the start that McQuillan's goal is more systematic than historical. To his credit, however, he takes up one of Giorgio Tonelli's posthumous works that highlights the role played by the syntagm "critical logic" in the context on eighteenth-century logic.[2] It is surprising, though, that the name of Antonio Genovesi, the author of the most incisive work on the topic, the Elementorum artis logicae-criticae libri quinque of 1745, is misspelled as "Genovisi" throughout, which hints at a second-hand reading of Tonelli's paper (p. 15). Tonelli had claimed that the tradition of the ars critica is present in Alexander Baumgarten's works in logic and aesthetics, where he makes it clear that there is a logical critique as well as an aesthetic critique and that both of them have an important role to play in judgment (p. 16).

Unfortunately, Tonelli does not provide a single citation supporting his claim that Kant derived his conception of critique from Baumgarten or the ars critica tradition [listed by Tonelli]. This should not be surprising, since Baumgarten is the only figure Tonelli associates with the ars critica tradition that Kant seems to be familiar with. There are no references to any of the other figures or works Tonelli mentions anywhere in Kant's works, correspondence, notes, or lectures. (p. 17)

Leaving behind the history of the sources and taking the standpoint of intellectual history, however, it is striking that Kant has a great familiarity with concepts that belong to the Aristotelian tradition (architectonic, art, category, habit, organon, science) and to the Stoic tradition (canon, discipline, system), without forgetting the Scholastic (transcendental) and the Renaissance (judgment). Words and concepts play a role. In fact, from the perspective of intellectual history as opposed to both the history of isolated arguments and the history of enumerations of opinions and theories, Donald Kelley and Johannes-Ulrich Schneider have pointed out the need of including a pragmatic consideration of the history of philosophy within intellectual history, which need not (or need no longer) be identified with the canon of philosophy. Intellectual historians study texts or their cultural analogues. The "intelligible field of study" more generally is language, or languages, and the history of philosophy is not the model of but rather a province in this larger realm of interpretation.[3]

McQuillan discusses a series of dilemmas, of which "dogmatic-critical" (p. 12) is the first and most fundamental. Other­ dilemmas follow, and McQuillan considers two of them: "art-science" (p. 12, 79) and "propaedeutic-system" (p. 69, 86).  But he surprisingly leaves out "canon-organon" and "formal-transcendental."

Eventually, McQuillan also rejects option two: he is convinced that Kant "denies logic is a critique" due to his wish to emphasize that critique itself "is a science" and to "distance it from aesthetics." This, McQuillan concludes, invites us to raise "serious doubts about any attempt to trace Kant's conception of critique back to logic." (p. 17)

Having argued that critique for Kant depends on neither aesthetics nor logic, McQuillan goes on to see what happens when critique is viewed in the context of the "science of the limits of human reason" (KgS 2:368). He considers the working title of Kant's book-project, which was to become the first Critique, as he had spelled it out in the letter to Markus Herz of June 7, 1771 (KgS 10:13): The Bounds of Sensibility and Reason (p. 40). Which brings us to Georg Friedrich Meier, who elaborated an apology for what is true, i.e., genuine metaphysics in opposition to its degenerated forms. Meier indicated the conditions of possibility for a future genuine metaphysics that ought to be a science (a distinct cognition based on certain and unshakeable foundations), which "merits this title and which explains and demonstrates as long as the limits of human cognition permit." All other known forms of metaphysics are the result of fallacies. [4] The solution proposed by Meier to the problem of the finitude of human cognition is purely quantitative. In fact, he compares first the amplitude of human cognition with that of the animals, and second with that other (non-human) thinking beings and spirits. The conclusion is that the human being is a microcosm due to the limits of human cognition.[5] McQuillan also rejects this third option.

The claim that metaphysics is the science of the limits of human reason simply means that metaphysics tells us what we can and cannot know.

The repugnance and even hatred Kant told Mendelssohn [KgS 10:70] he felt for the methods of contemporary metaphysics does not seem to have changed his view of metaphysics itself. (p. 41)

Finally, McQuillan comes to define the very idea of the first Critique through the notion of the possibility of a metaphysics that follows "a course similar to the one natural science had followed" (p. 80). In fact, in the second Preface (Bxxii), Kant boasts "that his critique will bring about 'an entire revolution' in metaphysics, 'according to the example of the geometers and natural scientists.'" (p. 81) That such a metaphysics is possible is McQuillan's assessment of what ought to have been the "very idea of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason."

Coming back to the question raised at the beginning: when Kant started to work on the first Critique, what kind of discipline did he want to contribute to? McQuillan points out, indeed, that Kant had tried "to show that his critique represents the culmination of philosophical history," and in fact he thought a good abstract, which eventually became the Prolegomena, "would help make his critique popular," although the "series of negative reviews soon disabused him of that notion." (p. 91)

Finally, let me suggest that an answer to the question about the "very idea" of Kant's oeuvre might be found in the opening chapter of the Transcendental Logic in the first Critique (A50-64/B74-88) "Introduction: Idea of a Transcendental Logic."[6] It has been shown on the basis of the number of its pages, its objective, its propaedeutic argumentation level, and especially its being "externally tacked on" to the Transcendental Analytic (as noticed by Kemp Smith[7]) that this section fulfills all the requirements for an academic program[8] This fact provides us with essential information about the process of composition of the first Critique (as a set of layers), particularly when it's combined with the fact that in the seventies Kant had indeed thought of lecturing at the Alma Albertina -- the University of Königsberg -- on the book he was working on.[9]  This book was closely connected to curren­­­­t textbooks on logic and metaphysics such as Johann Georg Heinrich Feder's Logik und Metaphysik,[10] which Kant knew well, because he had adopted it for his class. Things eventually did not take this course, and the Introduction did not appear first as an academic program. It is nonetheless important to keep in mind that for a certain number of years Kant's intention had been that of writing the Critique of Pure Reason as a logic and metaphysics textbook for students.

[1] Norman Kemp-Smith, A Commentary to Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, 2nd ed. (Palgrave, 2003), 1.

[2] Giorgio Tonelli, "Critique and Related Terms Prior to Kant: A Historical Survey," Kant-Studien 69 (1978), 119-48.

[3] Donald Kelley, "What is Happening in the History of Ideas?" Journal of the History of Philosophy 51 (1990), 3-25; Ulrich-Johannes Schneider, "Intellectual History and the History of Philosophy," Intellectual News 1 (1996), 8-30.

[4] Georg Friedrich Meier, Metaphysik, 2nd edn. (Gebauer, 1765), vol. 1., 6-7.

[5] Georg Friedrich Meier, Betrachtungen ueber die Schrancken der menschlichen Erkentniß (Hemmerde, 1755), p. 43, 56.

[6] Riccardo Pozzo, "Kant within the Tradition of Modern Logic: The Role of the 'Introduction: Idea of a Transcendental Logic'," Review of Metaphysics 52 (1998), 296-99.

[7] Norman Kemp-Smith, A Commentary to Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, 2nd ed. (Palgrave, 2003), 167.

[8] Philosophical Academic Programs of the German Enlightenment: A Literary Genre Recontextualized, ed. Seung Kee Lee et al. (Frommann-Holzboog, 2012), xv.

[9] Vorlesungsverzeichnisse der Universität Königsberg 1720-1804: Reprint mit einer Einleitung und Registern, ed. Michael Oberhausen et al. (Frommann-Holzboog, 1999), xxxvii, 458, 466, 472, 496.

[10] Johann Georg Feder, Logik und Metaphysik nebst der philosophischen Geschichte im Grundrisse (Dieterich, 1769).