Immaterial: Rules in Contemporary Art

Immaterial Rules In Contemporary Art

Sherri Irvin, Immaterial: Rules in Contemporary Art, Oxford University Press, 2022, 269pp., $34.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199688210.

Reviewed by Darren Hudson Hick, Furman University


All too often, philosophers of art (myself included) deal with art at a remove, at their desks, surrounded by books, countless tabs open in their browser windows. Reading Sherri Irvin’s book feels like you’re being led through a gallery that Irvin herself has carefully curated—indeed, led through the hidden corridors behind the gallery walls. Despite the title of this volume, Irvin makes the art she discusses feel material in a way that other philosophers just don’t—maybe can’t. Irvin makes me appreciate the art she discusses; she makes me love it.

In this book, her first monograph, Irvin brings together, revises, and expands upon a view she has been developing for two decades. Irvin’s focus here is on contemporary art, an artworld term imprecisely describing a broad swath of visual art created since the late 1960s, art that tends to expand, defy, or at least challenge longstanding traditions of art (“yes, it’s a painting, but that’s not all it is”), but which has nevertheless been embraced by gallerists and museum curators. Contemporary art doesn’t tend to look like the art that has preceded it, and when it does, something is afoot.

Irvin’s examples include Felix Gonzalez-Torres’s work, “Untitled” (Portrait of Ross in L.A.), a 1991 installation piece embodied in a pile of individually-wrapped candies. Whereas, typically, attempts to touch an artwork in a major gallery will invite swift intervention from security personnel, the candies making up “Untitled” are there for visitors to take and consume. Irvin also discusses Gerald Ferguson’s “Maintenance Paintings,” a series of flatly monochromatic works, where attached to the back of each is a notice from the artist stating (among other things) that the work may be repainted at the owner’s discretion. My favorite of Irvin’s offerings may be Jason Rhoades’s SLOTO: The Secret Life of the Onion, consisting in a set of yellow shelves upon which are set green glass bulbs shaped like onions. Past the shelves runs a track on which sits a child-sized carnival train whose cars are shaped like pigs. On the wall are instructions for museum staff, written in pencil, for constructing new onions, with staff members told to “[g]et into the head of the pig train, and with a constructed onion on your lap go around looking in not forward,” before placing the onion on a shelf. Staff, Irvin reports, play along (158).

Centrally, Irvin’s thesis is about what such art is made of. Gonzalez-Torres’s work is made of candies, yes, but not necessarily those candies, since the candies making up the pile may be entirely consumed, but the work cannot be. Any of Ferguson’s Maintenance Paintings is in part made of latex paint, but you (as the owner) may add your own paint, which becomes part of the work. And Rhoades’s SLOTO is made in part of a child-sized pig train intended for the conveyance of museum staff. But each of these works is also made of rules. Some of these are rules for display—rules about how the pile of candies is to be installed, and how it is to be replenished. Some of the rules are rules for conservation—what can and can’t be done to maintain them without their being destroyed. And some of the rules are rules for participation—about who can and who can’t interact with them, about who does and who doesn’t get to ride the pig train.

Although, Irvin suggests, some works of contemporary art are made entirely of rules, most works of contemporary art are “material–rule hybrids”. The complication—and at least part of the fascination—lies in determining what is and what isn’t an actual material component of the work, and what the rules are. What you see in an installation piece might be an entirely contingent element of the work—easily replaceable, like a piece of candy in Gonzalez-Torres’s “Untitled”, or altogether arbitrary, like the color of a Maintenance Painting. Or, it might be critical to the work that it is that very object. We won’t know unless we know the rules. The rules help to generate the work’s meaning. If Gonzalez-Torres’s pile of candies is replaced in perpetuity, this gives us one range of meaningful interpretations; if consuming the last candy in the pile means the utter destruction of the work, another range of meaningful interpretations is generated. Grasping the work’s rules is necessary to fully interpreting and understanding the work. In serving to generate the work’s meaning, the rules are part of the work’s medium.

On Irvin’s view, the rules are “sanctioned” by the artist, though this may be a complicated matter. Artists do not typically work in a vacuum, and contemporary artists in particular work with museums and galleries in order to realize their works. Installing a work may require first answering an array of questions. Does it matter where it hangs on the wall? If it’s flexible, can it go around a corner? Are there specific lighting requirements? What happens if we run out of candies? Conserving the work raises other questions. What if the lightbulb burns out—can I replace it with an LED bulb, or does it have to be an incandescent bulb? What if a vandal spray paints the Maintenance Painting? What if a museum employee is the culprit? What if the pig train breaks down? Irvin does a wonderful job of detailing the discussions—and, often, negotiations—between artists and the institutions that display their works. In answering these sorts of questions, artists are specifying the rules. It’s the nitty-gritty that makes Irvin’s cases so interesting, and her view so compelling.

Irvin’s theory is grounded in real-world art practices, and the real world is fascinating in its messiness. On Irvin’s view, the artist has special authority for sanctioning the rules that in part (or in whole) make up the work, but this is often a collaborative process. Museums are tasked both with protecting the works in their collections and with protecting the visitors who come to see them, and what an artist has in mind for her work may be at odds with either of these. In addition, things may change in unexpected ways, and artists may change the rules for their works, either in response to new circumstances (materials have begun to decay in unexpected ways) or simply because the artist has changed her mind. The rules making up the work change, and so (provided the changes are not too big and too sudden) the work itself changes.

Irvin works out the details of her view through ten chapters, revisiting several recurring cases as she catalogues an array of rules, how they come about, and how they contribute both to the meaning and the nature of the works. Chapter 1 sets up the basics of the view, and Chapters 2 through 4 focus on rules for display, rules for conservation, and rules for participation respectively. Chapter 5 is a deep dive into some hardcore ontology. The exploration is, I think, necessary for the project, and it’s about as clean as such metaphysics can probably get. But if there’s anything in the book that will deter or obstruct the non-specialist, it is this. I think, though, that such a reader might happily skip this chapter without a loss of coherence in the rest of the book. Chapters 6 and 7 focus on the notion of rules as medium, the meaning-bearing structure of a work, and Chapters 8 and 9 deal with some of the more complicated issues that arise from her theory: what if the rules are indeterminate, and what if the rules are violated? Finally, Chapter 10 is for the skeptics who have made it through all the preceding chapters but remain unconvinced. Here, Irvin works to answer a range of responses to her view, from the analytic “Is it really the artist’s work?” to the cynical “Rules suck!” to the petulant “You can’t make me.” Irvin’s responses are careful, charitable, and patient, and—I imagine—helped by the years that Irvin has been developing and workshopping her theory.

Still, I have a concern. Central to Irvin’s view is the understanding that art-making, like language, arises in community practices—here, art practices. The artworld includes roles for both artist and gallerist, and Irvin does a terrific job of illustrating the organic nature of that relationship as rules are negotiated: “There is a give and take between community norms and expectations supplied by the context, and my expressive activity within that context” (117). But in the cases that Irvin walks through, when you come right down to it, the artist gives all the rules and the community must take them. And, in general, I am skeptical of a position that gives such unchecked power to the artist. Artistic practices involve more than the activities of artists and the institutions that showcase their works. Irvin suggests, “To identify the functional role of the artwork, we have to look at the practices of the community” (25). However, Irvin notes, while David Davies’ “pragmatic constraint” focuses our attention on “critical and appreciative practice,” she will instead “privilege the practices of art creation, conservation, and curation that are centrally concerned with the artwork’s identity and persistence conditions” (24). In bracketing off the artgoing public’s practices, the picture that Irvin presents appears incomplete.

In suggesting that artworks are at least partly composed of rules, Irvin makes comparisons with games. There are games that one just plays with oneself, and there are artists who just make art for themselves, but I suspect these are both the exceptions. In typical cases, the artist wants the audience to play along, but this requires some buy-in, else the game of art is not being played by either party.

Irvin does make some moves towards addressing the notion of audience uptake. Discussing Ferguson’s Maintenance Paintings, Irvin notes, “owners of his works have been very conservative about repainting them, owing no doubt to the recognition that judgments about provenance and the associated economic value of the work are likely to remain tied to the expectation that the surface was painted by the artist’s own hand” (60). Later, she elaborates: “Collectors and institutions may rightly fear that were they to exercise the full permission to repaint these works, their market value would diminish; community understanding of artworks and their value does not immediately update when artists begin to challenge longstanding conventions” (156). This is not merely a general audience pushing back on something they don’t understand; collectors represent a substantive part of the artworld. Irvin’s language suggests that it’s really just a matter of time before the artworld “updates” its valuation, but why think that should happen at all? If the public at large continues to reject a repainted Maintenance Painting as the original, why think that Ferguson’s rule-sanctioning has been effective? Why think that an attempted sanctioning cannot be rebuffed?

In Chapter 3, and again briefly in Chapter 10, Irvin discusses Lawrence Weiner’s A WALL BUILT TO FACE THE LAND & FACE THE WATER, AT THE LEVEL OF THE SEA, installation of which, she says, “is simply a matter of displaying some inscription of the words constituting the title, even ‘in lipstick on a sidewalk’” (227). I wonder, then: does Irvin’s writing the title of the work in her book qualify as an instance of the work itself? Does my mention of it in this paragraph so qualify? Perhaps neither counts as a “display” of an “inscription”, but what if you print off this review and display it in a public-facing window? Can Irvin, or I, or you accidentally instantiate a work? Can Weiner make it so that we can? If so, how? If not, why not? Perhaps Irvin will say that an “inscription” cannot so qualify if I, the inscriber, don’t intend it as an instance of the work. But why couldn’t Weiner override that rule, making it the case that any inscription of those words in that order—whether intentional or not—is an instance of that work? I am inclined to think that an artist doesn’t have that kind of power, but that’s because I’m inclined to think that the community provides a check to the artist. At the very least, I need something more than a declaration that an artist has—or, for that matter, lacks—that kind of power.

In Chapter 7, Irvin discusses the case of Project Row Houses, an ongoing project envisioned by Rick Lowe and a team of artists, involving the reclaiming and revitalization of 22 row houses in Houston’s Third Ward, transforming the structures for a variety of purposes, including affordable artists’ studios, exhibition spaces, and housing for young single mothers. Irvin says, “Project Row Houses is understood not only as a community development project undertaken by a group of artists, but as part of their artistic practice, even though it does not employ sculptural forms or culminate in events that are identifiable as performances or displays” (167–8). Irvin asks whether we should be skeptical that those involved in such a project have created a work of art, “as opposed to art-adjacent community practices or sites” (168). Irvin ultimately grants that Project Row Houses is an artwork, though not simply because Lowe declares it as such:

In my view, whether something counts as an artwork depends on the practices of relevant communities: the fact that Lowe himself has identified Project Row Houses in a sustained way as part of his artistic practice, and that it has been recognized as an art project by critics, curators, and institutions, is a strong indicator of if not sufficient to establish art status. (168)

In other words, for Irvin, whether a thing counts as art (particularly a thing testing the boundaries of the category) is not simply a matter of creator fiat, but must be vetted by community uptake. My question is, why should we think of artistic sanctions—particularly the sort of boundary-testing artistic sanctions that characterize contemporary art—any differently?

Irvin works to ground her theory in artistic practice, but her approach sidelines a critical participant. In her practice-centered account, Irvin makes gallerists and curators participants in the negotiations over the rules making up the artist’s work. At the very least, I want an account of the larger public’s role in this aspect of art practice, and I am skeptical that such a role is as passive as Irvin’s view seems to suggest.

Ultimately, I am less concerned that Irvin will be unable to answer my worries, and simply more interested in the answer she might supply. Truthfully, I just want to talk about art with Irvin. I do not expect I will be alone here. (And the fact that the richly illustrated hardcover, with a third of the images in full color, is priced at a stunningly affordable $34.95, will certainly help open the door to conversation.) Irvin provides a scaffolding for a rich and renewed appreciation of contemporary art. More than that, Irvin inspires appreciation and new ways to appreciate art, which I don’t get to say about a lot of aestheticians.