Immortality and the Philosophy of Death

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Michael Cholbi (ed.), Immortality and the Philosophy of Death, Rowman and Littlefield, 2016, 243pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781783483846.

Reviewed by James Stacey Taylor, The College of New Jersey


In recent years there have been a renaissance of interest in the philosophy of death. Several important monographs, edited collections, and journal Special Issues have been published addressing such questions as whether death is a harm to the person who dies, whether persons can be harmed or benefitted by events that occur after their deaths, and whether or not immortality is desirable. Michael Cholbi's edited collection is an exceptionally welcome addition to this burgeoning conversation.

The collection consists of fourteen original essays, the majority of which were presented at the first conference of the International Association for the Philosophy of Death and Dying that was held at California State Polytechnic University in November 2013. The volume is divided into three parts. The papers in Part I address the question of whether death is bad for those who die; those in Part II (with one exception, of which more below) address some of the implications of the awareness that each human life will end in death's chilly embrace. The papers in Part III address the question of whether immortality would be good for us.

In the first paper of Part I, "Victims," Christopher Belshaw (writing with his characteristic brio) argues that while death can be bad for "a variety of living things" (p.9) this badness is important only when the victim of death is a person, and when the life that was lost was a good one that the person who died actually wanted to continue to live. For Belshaw, certain "actual desires are necessary for death to be bad" (p.14). This view is challenged by the second paper in Part I, Travis Timmerman's "Reconsidering Categorical Desire Views". Timmerman outlines a case (Operation) that he argues poses problems for "moment of death desire based views" (MODD views) (p.21) such as Belshaw's. In Operation Unlucky Louie undergoes a heart operation in the hopes that this will enable him to live longer to satisfy his desires. He dies on the operating table. However, the surgeon could resuscitate him -- but does not, as she reasons that while his death was bad for him, since he no longer has any desires not resuscitating him is not bad for him. But, Timmerman, holds, while this is an implication of MODD views, it is absurd -- and so those views should be rejected. Timmerman's paper is an elegant masterpiece of philosophical reasoning, and while it is not as clearly "absurd" as he thinks to deny that it is bad for Unlucky Louie not to be resuscitated (a neo-Epicurean could readily deny this) it does seem counterintuitive for a non-Epicurean such as Belshaw to deny this. This paper should spark a lively debate over MODD views.

In the third paper of Part I ("Epicureanism, Extrinsic Badness, and Prudence") Karl Ekendahl and Jens Johansson argue that two of the most common objections that Epicureanism about death is faced with -- that it does not provide a person with a prudential reason to avoid her own death, and that it cannot account for the moral wrongness of (painless and anxiety-free) killing -- are misplaced. In brief, they argue that even if a person's death is not extrinsically bad for her she still has reason to avoid it (and hence persons have moral reasons to avoid killing) as the paths that would lead to it would not maximize her receipt of intrinsic value. This response to two of the most pressing worries that the Epicurean is held to be faced with is a forceful one -- indeed, so forceful is it that after reading this paper it is difficult to see why it has had such traction with anti-Epicureans.

In the fourth paper in Part I, "Lucretius and the Fear of Death," Frederik Kaufman continues to defend his seminal response to the Lucretian "symmetry problem" (that it is not possible for someone to have existed earlier than she did, although she could have existed later than she did) against critics. Kaufman's paper is followed by Duncan Purves' "The Harms of Death," in which he offers a counterfactual comparative account of harm that, he argues, is superior to other accounts of harm in making sense of the badness of death. The question of whether death is bad for the one who dies often takes as its starting point the Epicurean view that a person's death marks the end of her existence, or, at least, of her existence as a thing to which the predicates of "harm" or "benefit' could apply.

Sophie-Grace Chappell challenges this assumption by offering some new thoughts about the New Testament doctrine of the general resurrection. "Seeds: On Personal Identity and the Resurrection" is a fascinating paper, albeit one whose central argument is frustratingly elusive. Chappell argues that what matters for resurrection is that the resurrected person be connected to a pre-resurrection living person in such a way that the pre-resurrection person could care about what will happen to the resurrected person. That seems correct. Furthermore, she argues, no matter what one's theory of personal identity, what matters to ground such caring is that there be continuity of consciousness between the pre-resurrected living person and the resurrected person. That also seems correct. Then, drawing on the New Testament metaphor of the relationship between currently living persons and resurrected persons as being akin to that which holds between a seed and a plant, she argues that what matters is how much continuity there is between the resurrected person who serves as the telos for the pre-resurrected living person. But precisely what this relationship is, or how it grounds continuity of consciousness, is unclear, especially given the necessary gap of death that separates these two conciousnesses. Moreover, if the resurrected person is the "ideal future me" (p.97) questions can be raised about whether I would care about my idealized future self in the way that Chappell needs to ground the view that I share a continuity of consciousness with him. If, for example, the ideal me is far removed from the (very) base me that actually exists, why should I care about him absent independent, non-self-regarding, reasons to do so?

While the papers in Part I are engaged in the traditional philosophical debate over the badness of death, those in Part II (with one exception) raise new and interesting issues concerning the effects that awareness of our own eventual deaths will have on our experiences of our lives. David Beglin initiates Part II with his paper "Fearing Death as Fearing the Loss of One's Life: Lessons from Alzheimer's Disease". Addressing the views of those (especially Kai Draper) who (like Epicurus) hold that death is not a proper object of fear, Beglin argues that the fear of death could be fitting for the same reasons as Alzheimer's patients might fear the encroachment of their disease: a concern with "losing one's agency and practical identity" (p.102).

Beglin's paper is followed by Beverly Clack's "Constructing Death as a Form of Failure: Addressing Mortality in a Neoliberal Age". Clack's thesis is unclear, but it appears to be that within "neoliberal discourse" death is a form of failure and that this "renders impossible discussion about what it means to be a mortal subject" (p.129). Instead of this approach we should, she asserts, recognize our shared vulnerability, and this will help us prioritize the important things that "emerge from our shared life", such as "love, relationship, friendship, laughter" (p.129). If this brief precis of Clack's contribution leaves one wondering what neoliberalism has to do with death being a form of failure and why viewing death in this way makes it "impossible" to discuss "what it means to be a mortal subject" and to recognize the value of things that "emerge from shared life", reading the paper won't help.

There is so much that is obviously wrong with Clack's paper that it is hard to know where to begin. However, for reasons of space a methodological point and a substantive criticism will have to suffice. The methodological point first. Clack cites no proponent of the "neoliberal" view that she criticizes. Instead, her exegeses of this view are drawn entirely from secondary sources that are critical of it. To base criticisms of a position on its critics' characterizations of it is, at best, intellectually lazy, and at worst intellectually dishonest. Substantively (and in part perhaps because she draws on its critics for information about it) Clack gets the neoliberal view badly wrong. It is simply false that neoliberals (who are advocates of voluntary association) hold that solidarity with others is "a sign of weakness" (p.117, quoting Philip Mirowski's popular work Never Let a Serious Crisis Go to Waste). It is simply false that neoliberals are committed to seeing death as a personal failure (as a socio-economic position neoliberalism has no views of any kind on death), and it is simply false that neoliberals fail to recognize that there are things that we cannot control. Indeed, on this last point there is a deep irony in Clack equating neoliberalism with Hayekian views and then criticizing it for failing to recognize that there are socioeconomic forces that lie outside our control. (Perhaps Clack should be reminded of exactly why Hayek received his Nobel Prize.)

Fortunately, the papers by Dan Werner, Kathy Behrendt, and Aaron Smuts redeem Part II through their sheer excellence. Werner and Smuts examine various relationships that hold between love and death. In "Love and Death" Werner examines three claims made about love and death made by participants in Plato's Symposium (that all lovers -- and only lovers -- are willing to die for each other, that love is a desire to be amalgamated into another, losing one's identity in the process, and that in loving we evince a desire for immortality) and finds them all wanting. Smuts is also concerned with the relationship between love and death in ""Love and Death: The Problem of Resilience," arguing that the apparent fact that persons are resilient in the face of the loss of a loved one is cause for regret. In "Learning to be Dead: The Narrative Problem of Mortality" Behrendt notes that death presents a challenge to persons who believe that lives should be viewed as narratives (for while it completes a life its inaccessibility to the person whose life it ends precludes her from having access to the whole narrative of her life) and then offers a plausible solution to this problem.

In Part I the majority of the contributors hold that death could be a harm to the person who dies. This might be taken to imply that immortality -- at least of a certain sort -- would be desirable. This question is taken up by the papers in Part III. In "Immortality, Identity, and Desirability" Roman Altshuler examines Bernard Williams' famous argument that immortality cannot be desirable, at least for human beings, and provocatively concludes that the pertinent question to ask is not whether immortality is desirable, but whether "it is even possible to desire it" (p.200). Adam Buben argues in "Resources for Overcoming the Boredom of Immortality in Fischer and Kierkegaard" that Kierkegaard's views concerning "unending self-cultivation" have affinities with John Martin Fischer's views of "repeatable pleasures" and could be drawn upon to provide further reason to believe that indefinitely extended lifespans would have value to those who possess them. In the final paper in this collection, "Immortality and the Exhaustibility of Value," Michael Cholbi develops a highly original argument for the view that we "have a plausible basis for opting for mortality over immortality" (p.235). In part, Cholbi argues, this is because while the balance of goods and bads in immortal lives will eventually converge, mortals will experience only a subset of possible goods and bads. Hence, "It is … available to mortals to craft a life that surpasses the threshold of well-being that each and every immortal converges upon" (p.230). But there are two reasons why we might resist this line of argument. First, I see no reason to believe Cholbi's claim that an immortal's exercise of her action would only "foreclose eudaimonic possibilities temporarily" with the bads she wishes to avoid being "nigh, come what may" (p. 231). Second, since persons' temperaments differ it is not obvious that the levels of well-being present in immortal lives will converge. Consider the difference between Evelyn Waugh's characters Captain Grimes (of Decline and Fall) and John Verney (of "Tactical Exercise"). While Grime's cheerfulness is unaffected by the obstacles in his path (a death sentence, imprisonment for bigamy) Verney experiences an "invisible sheet-lightning of hate which flashed and flickered deep inside him at every obstruction or reverse" (p.420, 2012). Surely an immortal happy-go-lucky Grimes would be much happier than an endlessly miserable Verney?

That the essays in this volume have stimulated so many questions in this short review should be taken as a testament to their interest -- and hence to the excellence of this volume as a whole. A few quibbles remain. It is, for example, disappointing that it contains no extended discussion of the possibility of posthumous harm, or of the question concerning what precisely death is. Yet these quibbles notwithstanding Immortality and the Philosophy of Death is an extremely valuable addition to the philosophical literature on these fascinating issues.


Mirowski, Philip. (2014). Never Let a Serious Crisis Go to Waste: How Neoliberalism Survived the Financial Meltdown. Verso.

Waugh, Evelyn. (2012). "Tactical Exercise" in Evelyn Waugh, The Complete Stories. Back Bay Books.