Immortality in Ancient Philosophy

Immortality In Ancient Philosophy

Alexander G. Long (ed.), Immortality in Ancient Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2021, 227pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108832281.

Reviewed by Gretchen Reydams-Schils, University of Notre Dame


The editor of this volume, Alexander G. Long, has himself written a monograph on the topic of death and immortality in Ancient Philosophy (2019). His own contribution to this volume is based on that work (see below). The collection of essays pursues the notion of ‘immortality’ both in our terms, such as ‘everlastingness,’ and in the terms the ancient authors themselves would have used, with a focus on the immortal as ‘deathless’ (athanatos).

The explicit aim of the work is to broaden the discussion beyond psychology as views of the structure of the soul itself in its relation with the body, with a distinction, for instance, between mortal and immortal soul components. (It is well-known that Plato’s analysis of the structure of the human soul appears to be inconsistent across different works.) These essays, as the introduction points out, also address questions of the soul’s relation to the divine, and theology as the ancients defined this branch of knowledge; the kind of life the soul is supposed to have after death; and the question of identity through the different phases of the soul’s existence. The framework of these questions distinguishes this collection of essays from an earlier volume edited by Dorothea Frede and Burkhard Reis (Body and Soul in Ancient Philosophy, 2009, which, however, does have a section devoted to Aristotle, treated here only in Long’s contribution together with Early Stoicism and Epicureanism). The introduction and many of the essays build on the distinction made by David Sedley in this earlier work between ‘essential immortality,’ that is, immortality that belongs to the soul simply as a function of what it is, and ‘earned immortality,’ which results from the soul’s behavior and choices in life (‘Three kinds of Platonic immortality,’ in Frede and Reis (eds.), 145–162). Another merit of this work is its broad range, which includes also authors such as Philo of Alexandria and Augustine. Moreover, the quality of the individual contributions is consistently excellent, so I merely offer some points for further discussion below.

In ‘The soul and the celestial afterlife in Greek philosophy before Plato’ Simon Trépanier starts from his reading of Plato’s Phaedo (see also the contributions by Suzanne Obdrzalek and Catherine Rowett, who each adopt a different position) to establish a contrast between what he sees as the myth’s ultimate ruling out of ‘earned immortality’ (see above) and a view of earned longevity in Heraclitus and Empedocles. Both these philosophers, he argues, establish a form of celestial afterlife in which souls that are in a good condition could survive temporarily the death of the body. In the case of Heraclitus, ‘survival is granted to a select few as the mark of their distinction; it is also a promotion to a new, celestial level of life and consciousness, an apotheosis’ (27). There would be a limit to this kind of afterlife, whereas the cosmos would have an essential immortality, and the lesser deities could either die and transition into human existence or be absorbed into the celestial fire. For his analysis of Empedocles’ views, Trépanier builds on his own earlier work, and the principle of reading all the extant fragments as belonging together. In this instance, he posits, even the cosmos is only long-lived (because of Empedocles’ alternation of cycles), as are the lesser gods and human souls that earn the status of long-lived daimones.

Phillip Horky’s contribution to this collection, ‘Pythagorean immortality of the soul,’ presents the most provocative claim. He applies a strong historical scepticism to the evidence in our sources that the Pythagoreans endorsed the immortality of the soul. Instead, he posits that ‘the Pythagorean soul was atomic, material, and perishable’ (44), while allowing for a very minimal form of transmigration (souls moving through several bodies) (63). Horky takes his readers through an impressive reassessment of the sources, but his conclusion, I would argue, is not as securely established as he asserts at the end of his paper.

Horky argues that even many of our earlier sources have been contaminated by Plato’s views, and that this feature of the reports should put us on guard. But if these sources perhaps make the Pythagorean material sound too Platonic, the alternative view Horky develops would make it more difficult to detect why Pythagorean views mattered to Plato (and the later Platonists) in the first place—it may create too big a gap, in other words. But not all the connections on which Horky relies are strong. For instance, Horky argues that Aristotle’s account in his De anima (1.3, 407b13–24) shows traces of having been influenced by the character Cebes’ analogy in Plato’s Phaedo (87b3–e7) between the soul and body, on the one hand, and a human being wearing a cloak, on the other. But the connection between Aristotle’s report and Cebes’ analogy rests only on the former using the notion of a soul enduesthai eis a body: Horky translates this phrase as ‘is clothed in,’ but the verb (which does not occur in the relevant Plato passage) can also have a more generic meaning: ‘go into’ as ‘enter’/or ‘press in’ (as Plato himself uses it in Phaedo 82a, also with eis: about reincarnation into animals, which I would argue is the best parallel for Aristotle’s report, and 89d; also Aristotle himself in the same passage, 407b25). Moreover, even if Cebes’ analogy is Pythagorean in origin, from the mere fact that he puts it forward as a potential counter-argument to immortality it does not follow that he and the Pythagoreans actually endorsed its implications.

Obdrzalek (‘The philosopher’s reward: contemplation and immortality in Plato’s dialogues’) focuses on Plato’s Phaedo and Symposium. A distinction she detects in the Phaedo between what she calls ‘general (instead of essential) immortality’ and earned immortality as assimilation to the changelessness of Forms allows her to make sense of a passage in the Symposium that seems to suggest that souls in their mental states and knowledge are as much in flux as bodies are (207c–208b): this passage, she argues would still allow for a form of immortality as a persistence in time, but implies that by themselves humans are incapable of changeless eternity, i.e., the mode of existence of the Forms.

Obdrzalek’s analysis of the Phaedo and Rowett’s contribution (‘Pre-existence, life after death, and atemporal beings in Plato’s Phaedo’) complement one another. Rowett’s argument rests on a fine-grained analysis of different senses of ‘death’ and ‘life’ in the Phaedo. Rowett argues that over the course of this work Plato gradually shifts his perspective from the soul’s persistence through time to a view of the soul that shares the changeless eternity of the Forms (in line with Obdrzalek’s thesis). I found especially illuminating two of her claims, first, that the state of death as the separation between soul and body is described as one of ‘being’ in the case of the soul, and ‘becoming’ in case of the body (64c2–9), and, second, that we should heed the distinction between bios-life and zoê-life. Bios is the temporal existence (and life throughout a cycle of reincarnations) that the human soul-body compound experiences. Zoê, on the other hand, allows Plato, in his so-called Final Argument for human immortality (102a10–107b10), to posit the soul as that which always brings life with it and thus cannot admit death at all (though the account does not involve ‘consciousness’ or ‘awareness’ in the sense in which Rowett uses those terms).

For Obdrzalek the Symposium appears to present a different challenge than the one in the flux-passage: an ‘ontological chasm’ between souls and Forms, so that (human) souls, in fact, could never fully or permanently attain the affinity with the Forms which the Phaedo appears to assume. Hence, Obdrzalek argues in a developmental move, Plato in later works such as the Phaedrus, the Laws, and especially the Timaeus ‘downgrades the requirements for earned immortality,’ by considering an immortality within time (‘everlastingness’) that relies on a maximally stable form of circular motion. But while her other arguments about the limitations of human beings in the Symposium make sense, I am less convinced by the claim that, in this context, human knowledge of a Form would consist only of a ‘representation of Form’ (88). First, Plato’s claim about the flux in a human soul’s knowledge (epistêmê, in the plural) might rely on a distinction between ‘mere’ knowledge and wisdom (sophia). But more importantly, the passage about the soul giving birth which Obdrzalek herself quotes (81; Symposium 212a) indicates that the soul is in touch with ‘true virtue’ and ‘truth,’ not with ‘images’ (eidôla) of virtue. So, I think that we need a different explanation for the limits to human affinity with the Forms, which, I would argue, result rather from the specific structure of the human soul and its embodied condition, which ‘drag it down’ into the temporality of a bios, as Rowett proposes.

The contributions in the volume are arranged in the chronological order of the material they discuss, and so James Warren’s article ‘Socrates and the symmetry argument,’ which focuses on the ps.-Platonic dialogue Axiochus, dated around the first century BCE, is placed after that of Long. In content, however, it fits well with the other two contributions on Plato. The account invokes in one and the same context both Epicurean-sounding claims that (a) just as before birth humans do not have perception and do not exist, so the same holds after death, and (b) thus death is nothing to us, and the Platonic view of the immortality of the soul (365d1–366b1). Instead of interpreting these claims as creating an irresolvable tension, Warren argues convincingly not only that on some level they are part of an elenctic move to catch Axiochus in his own contradictions, but also, and more importantly, that they pave the way for stating that the soul when leaving the body has an awareness that is very different from the kind of perception that relies on the body’s sense organs: the soul in effect abandons all particular features that would characterize a specific individual in a given space and time. So, here Warren focuses on the problem of identity and persistence. It is true to say that ‘Axiochus’ as this specific individual will die, just as the ending of the Phaedo states, Warren argues, that in this sense Socrates has died too. But in another and much more important sense any human being is in essence her or his immortal soul. For this argument, Warren could also have drawn support from Rowett’s reflections that the soul, in the Phaedo, is said to leave its bios (or what we might call its ‘biography’) behind.

Long, in a paper that is a newer version of a chapter of his monograph on immortality (see above; ‘The immortal and the imperishable in Aristotle, Early Stoicism and Epicureanism’) starts from the realization that ‘godlikeness’ does not always have to entail immortality. On the basis of this claim, he argues that the comparison between human and divine in the Nicomachean Ethics focuses on the aspects of virtue (and happiness presumably), and that the mortal/immortal distinction enters only in Aristotle’s refutation of the view that humans should think merely ‘mortal thoughts’ (1177b30–1178a2).

For his analysis of Epicurean and the Stoic Chrysippus’ views, Long relies on a distinction between ‘immortality’ and ‘imperishability.’ The Epicurean evidence would indicate that while humans are perishable (in body and soul), the wise person can possess ‘immortal goods,’ and be godlike in that respect. Metrodorus, however, (if Seneca’s account is to be trusted, Ep. 98.9) appears to take a further step in implying that immortal goods would in effect bestow immortality, in some sense. According to the evidence preserved for Chrysippus, as Long interprets it, the intra-cosmic gods would be perishable because they would cease to exist at the point of conflagration, but could still be considered immortal insofar as (a) they are not subject to a separation of soul and body; and (b) they have an essential connection to the providential order of the world while it lasts. Virtuous human beings, though they are subject to the separation of soul and body at death, can emulate the immortality of the intra-cosmic gods, as heroes or demons, in this second aspect. By contrast, Panaetius, who rejects the notion of periodical conflagrations, considers the human soul to be intrinsically mortal (Cicero Tusculan Disputations 1.79).

In his incisive contribution Sami Yli-Karjanmaa (‘Immortality in Philo of Alexandria’) relies on a distinction between what he calls ‘ontological’ death and an ‘ethical’ kind—which could be fruitfully compared, I think, with the essential/earned immortality distinction that undergirds many of the papers in this volume. Philo’s notion of the ‘death of the soul’ is the ethical kind of death, which is opposed to ‘life’ (zoê at De gigantibus 14, see Rowett’s contribution above, not ‘immortality’), and stands for a soul that in its struggle to avoid being dragged down by the body and passions (which would constitute a kind of ‘corporealization’ of mind/soul) finds itself mired in vice. He argues, however, that this state is reversible through repentance and the power of reason and virtue, and with the help of God. (On a minor point, it would be better to avoid terms such as ‘grace,’ even when the Greek has charis, and ‘salvation’ because of their distinctly Christian overtones—although it is true that Christian authors used ideas derived from Philo.) If we accept the thesis which the author developed in his earlier book (Reincarnation in Philo of Alexandria 2015), we do not have to assume that for Philo not all souls are immortal. Rather, after the initial embodiment that is part of the original order of the universe and hence not evil as such (as in Plato’s Timaeus, one might add), it is the soul’s choices that will determine its subsequent fate: if it turns to vice and away from God, it undergoes a kind of death, and unless it finds its way back to virtue, it will have to keep going through more incarnations. At the other end of the spectrum, the virtuous human being in its relation with the divine would become pure mind (a process which the author calls ‘monadization’) and escape the condition of embodiment and reincarnation altogether.

Lloyd Gerson (‘Plotinus on immortality and the problem of personal identity’) provides a detailed analysis of Plotinus’ arguments for the soul’s immateriality and hence immortality (or separability) in Ennead IV 7 [2]. Plotinus refutes what he presents as the Stoic view of a corporeal soul, and a Pythagorean and Peripatetic position that each come too close, in his analysis, to the notion of soul as a quality of a body. One could, I would argue, respond to Plotinus’ critique of the Stoics, as Gerson presents his arguments, by pointing out that (a) the Stoics too posit that ‘sense-perception’ is ‘set immediately within a conceptual framework’ (185) through the so-called incorporeal ‘sayables’ (lekta), the propositions into which humans render sensory data; and (b) the Stoics would retort to Plotinus and other Platonists that an incorporeal soul could not interact with a human body—that the ontological gap would prove insurmountable. Gerson concludes with some reflections on personal identity in the light of his detailed analysis: at the level of Intellect, the undescended soul no longer has any use for what I have called the biography of its embodied existence; these features fall away, and though the notion of Forms of Individuals would allow for distinctions, it is also the case that ‘disembodied identity is, for Plotinus, found within a community of intellects all the members of which are contemplating the entirety of intelligible reality’ (193–194).

Finally, Sebastian Gertz (‘Truth and immortality in Augustine’s Soliloquies and De immortalitate animae) provides a detailed analysis of Augustine’s discussion of the soul’s impersonal immortality through its relation with truth, in the two works mentioned in the title. The three questions Augustine raises could have functioned very well as a structuring device for the entire volume: does the soul exist forever, and if so, what kind of existence would it have; if it lives forever, what would its life consist in; if knowledge, does the soul always have knowledge? In the Soliloquies and the first part of the De immortalitate animae, Gertz avers, Augustine starts out with the thesis that immortality belongs essentially to the soul in that truth is in the soul as in a subject. But the argument would only work if the soul is free from any substantial change, which if it occurred would affect the truth in it. This same problem also affects Augustine’s second approach, in the latter part of the De immortalitate animae, when he posits rather that truth and the soul are both substances, and that the soul ‘acquires’ immortality insofar as it is conjoined with truth. The question then arises what would happen to a soul if it turns away from this knowledge (‘through some sinful inclination,’ 209). Could this turning away lead to the destruction of the soul, as Augustine suggests in his later De civitate dei (13.2.18–20, mentioned in n.45)? In his earlier work Augustine, according to Gertz, leaves this last problem unresolved. Gertz analysis is lucid and compelling, but the paper would have benefited from more of an exchange with and cross-references to some of the other contributions, notably those on the Phaedo and on Philo of Alexandria’s notion of the ‘death of the soul.’ (And if Yli-Karjanmaa risks making Philo sound too Christian, Gertz analysis tends to the other extreme—of bracketing the Christian features of Augustine’s thought.)

If I have any issue with this excellent collection, it would be precisely that more connections could have been established between the different chapters. But it is, again, truly remarkable how each contribution in its own right deepens our understanding of what is at stake in discussions of immortality in Ancient Philosophy.