Immunity: the Evolution of an Idea

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Alfred I. Tauber, Immunity: the Evolution of an Idea, Oxford University Press, 2017, 303pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190651244.

Reviewed by Melinda Bonnie Fagan, University of Utah


Tauber's new book characterizes immunology as a science concerned with the establishment and maintenance of identity and individuality. As with much of Tauber's previous work, the book is concerned with the transformation of fundamental ideas about immunity. Tauber advocates an alternative to the currently-prevalent conception of immunity as defense of an autonomous individual self. On this alternative, which he terms "the ecological view," the immune self is not a fixed entity but dynamic, emerging continuously from interactions between the organism as traditionally conceived and its internal and external environments. The book's central argument is that the ecological view is more comprehensive and better empirically-supported than its entrenched rival. Tauber characterizes the hoped-for transformation as a radical disciplinary reorientation, positioning immunology among the environmental sciences and reinforcing its ties to studies of cognition. The book's overall thesis, in brief, is that immunity today should be "understood as a complex cognitive-communicative system" (20).

The argument for this ambitious thesis unfolds across six chapters, with a flanking introduction and epilogue. There is some overlap with Tauber's previous work, so readers familiar with his extensive oeuvre on immunology and ideas of the self will likely anticipate some of the book's arguments and conclusions. As in his earlier books (Tauber and Chernyak 1991, Tauber 1994, Podolsky and Tauber 1997), this volume's organization traces the history of immunology, beginning with the foundational theories of Metchnikoff and Burnet (Chapter 1). The former, Tauber argues, pre-figures his own ecological view, although Burnet's clonal selection theory (CST) became the dominant framework for immunology. CST posits that the full range of antibody receptor diversity is initially present within the organism, but that self-reactive immune cells (lymphocytes) are "deleted" in early development, so that only those reactive with "non-self" remain, to defend the organism against pathogens for the rest of its life. Focusing carefully on Metchnikoff's and Burnet's writings, Tauber convincingly shows key contrasts between their two views of immunity and of the self. Chapter 2 examines Jerne's anti-idiotype network theory as a step toward an alternative framework, moving beyond Burnet's dichotomy of "self/non-self." Jerne's theory, Tauber argues, posits neither self nor other, but only the system: a 'self-referential' interconnected network of molecular interactions. More recent theories of immunity, including that of Pradeu (2012), are characterized as successors to Jerne, retaining his basic principles. Alongside this exploration of Jerne is a more general comparative account of four distinct conceptions of the self, associated with different immunological theories.

The ecological perspective comes to the fore in Chapter 3, which links ideas about immune agency to symbiosis and evolution of individuality. The main claim here is that new evidence about the prevalence of symbiosis between microorganisms and multicellular organisms (as traditionally conceived) necessitates revision of the concept of immune selfhood, re-focusing the field to encompass a broad continuum of relationships between the organism and its environment. This conceptual change is further supported, Tauber argues, by experimental results, which collectively show that immunity is mediated by a complex molecular and cellular network involving context-dependent effects. Chapter 4 elaborates the ecological view in terms of "the cognitive metaphor," attributing concepts of agency and autonomy to immune phenomena. The basic premise of this chapter is that different models of cognition are associated with different notions of agency, such that change in one requires change in the other. Tauber considers two such cognitive models, corresponding to alternative conceptions of the immune self, in detail: "subject-object epistemology," in which the world is represented to an autonomous cognitive agent, and cognition without representation, which tracks the transmission of information irrespective of traditional subject/object boundaries. Marshaling ideas from theorists of cognition and of immunity, Tauber outlines a view of immune cognition without commitment to an autonomous self, elaborating the idea from "ecological, enactivist, and autopoietic perspectives" (137).

Chapter 5 returns to the history of immunology, identifying ecological ideas in foundational theories (notably Burnet's), and anointing the new sub-field of "eco-immunology" as the locus of "a major change in immunology's conceptual character" (166). Eco-immunology (currently a minor strand within immunology more generally[1]) considers the organism in its "full ecological context," ranging from host defense to "beneficial exchanges" requiring immune tolerance (164). This balanced, inclusive view, Tauber claims, more adequately accounts for autoimmunity and tolerance, as well as the context-dependence and complexity of immune responsiveness, than the traditional view of immunity as defense of the self from non-self pathogens. The chapter reiterates key points from earlier chapters to present the idea of a dynamic, context-dependent view of immunity comprising interactions within and without the organism. Parallels between that view and the core principles of systems biology are the starting-point for Chapter 6. However, apart from programmatic remarks indicating such parallels, this chapter deals with rather different issues than its predecessors: systems models, the character of causation, mechanisms, and complexity. Chapter 6 thus seems somewhat disconnected from the book's main argument, although Tauber's overview of current systems biology is perceptive and insightful. A short epilogue summarizes the book's main argument and intertwined themes of relational, context-dependent immunity, symbiosis and information-transmission.

As even this short summary illustrates, Tauber's account of immunity is too richly sourced and thematically complex to examine in detail here. I will limit my remarks to three points, two of which will be brief. My discussion will incline toward the critical - but this is not to deny the many strengths of Tauber's book, of which the above should give some indication.

First, one of the book's main conclusions is that immunology is on the cusp of radical reconceptualization, and that this transformation is to be welcomed, and is even necessary. In support of this claim, Tauber notes several objections to the "self/non-self" framework. One, which is very plausible and empirically well-supported, is that that framework is inadequate to the current science of immunology. Tauber notes on page 1 that the same cells and molecules that comprise the system for animal host defense also play other roles in the body associated with immunity: 'surveillance' for cancer cells, 'recycling' damaged cells, maintaining tolerance to certain antigens, constitutive, continuous autoimmune interactions, etc. Therefore, immunity should be reconceived so as to accommodate all those roles within a single conceptual framework. Elaborations and variations on this argument recur throughout the book; e.g., that immune responsiveness is determined, not by molecular specificity of "self-other" binding interactions, but by a complex regulatory network involving diverse features of the situation (or context) in any particular case. This line of argument is cogent and persuasive. But it does not lead to Tauber's strong conclusion, namely, that sweeping conceptual reform and disciplinary re-identification of immunology is needed. Many fields of molecular, cellular and developmental biology have in the past few decades moved away from reductionist explanations and simple molecular models, with attendant conceptual change. Yet in these fields, radical disciplinary change is neither observed nor (programmatic statements from some systems biologists aside) advocated. Certainly, there is conceptual change afoot in these fields -- of philosophical interest, even! -- but not of the drastic sort that Tauber calls for in immunology.

Tauber's strong claims rely on additional assumptions, that are not fully explicit in the book. His additional criticisms of the idea of the immune self offer some hints. It is a problem, he thinks, that there are multiple ways to distinguish self from non-self. Due to this variation, there is no single established criterion for establishing "the immune self;" i.e., no definition of 'the immune self.' Also, although the idea of the immune self has long been fundamental to immunology, unifying diverse phenomena, the concept's role is "rhetorical" and "practical" only; it lacks "epistemological standing" (57). Because of these shortcomings, the science of immunology needs "a more rigorous account of [its] fundamental categories" (97). It seems that Tauber takes for granted that immunology has, and must have, a single fundamental conceptual core -- an idea that is fundamental, intrinsic, and inseparable from immunology itself (51). Traditionally, that core has been the autonomous and isolated self (individual agent or organism), which requires defense from external 'others' (non-self). Pluralism or ambiguity in this conceptual core is unacceptable; with multiple ways to distinguish self from non-self, 'the center cannot hold.'[2] Although diverse immune phenomena have been interpreted in terms of this "self/non-self dichotomy," the concept cannot consistently account for them all; the unification of immunology in self/non-self terms falls short of scientific standards. It follows that an alternative framework that avoids these shortcomings must amount to total conceptual reform and re-interpretation of immunity from new first principles.

It is worth asking, though, whether immunology (or any science) needs a single fundamental theoretical core to succeed. The substantial philosophical literature on models and modeling would suggest otherwise; many fields are characterized by diverse, even incompatible, models of the same or related phenomena (e.g., Morgan and Morrison 2001, Winsberg 2010). A related concern is that immunology is driven at least as much by experimental techniques and clinical goals as by theory (Fagan 2007) -- I return to this point below. Tauber does not engage the philosophical literature on multiple models, and sidelines experimental and clinical practices from the conceptual core of immunology. Both moves are questionable. A further questionable assumption is that the associations between immunity, agency and identity which Tauber so ably and subtly limns in the self/non-self framework are unbreakable. That is, the concept of self that Tauber discerns in mainstream 20th century immunology carries with it considerable baggage, which cannot be put down.

The unifying usefulness of Burnet's "idiom of the self" hinges on its "deeper metaphorical allusion to agency" (51), and the idea of the immune self "is that of a circumscribed core identity closely akin to a Cartesian understanding of a thinking thing . . . its characteristic insularity resonates with modernist notions of personal autonomy" (223).[3] The conceptual connections among individuality, cognition and agency are fundamental to immunology -- and so no modest revisions of the concept of the immune self that dispense with these associations are possible. Nothing short of complete conceptual overhaul of all these notions can suffice to deal with the shortcomings of the self/non-self framework. But Tauber never explains why ideas about immunity and richly-elaborated concepts of agency, causality, and cognition are irrevocably conjoined in this way. For example: Tauber claims that if there is "no circumscribed, autonomous entity that is a priori designated 'the self'" then there is no immune self (108). Why could not the idea of the immune self change -- especially if it is so flexible in use -- to accommodate the dynamical, processual self? Why does Tauber see only one path open for justified conceptual change in immunology -- the one leading to the ecological view? The lack of answers makes this book's argument less compelling for readers with different views of conceptual change.

Second, Tauber anticipates and advocates a new "disciplinary partnership" of immunology and ecology (6-8), and a new "eco-evo-devo synthesis" amounting to a wholesale re-imagining of immunology as an environmental or ecological science. But he does not discuss how this sweeping transformation would impact the experimental and clinical aspects of immunology. To be sure, Tauber is aware of these aspects of the field. But his concern throughout is to "illuminate the deep philosophical infrastructure that guides" theoretical approaches in immunology (160). And in so doing, he sidelines many significant experimental methods and applications in immunology: vaccines, cell culture, NOD-SCID mice, FACS analysis, and so on. This prioritization of theory over all other aspects of immunology makes for a rather imbalanced account. Might not the experimental and clinical aspects of immunology, which shape the work of practicing immunologists, also bear on the field's conceptual foundations and core themes? Even if they do not, surely experimental and clinical practices must have a place in the proposed new discipline of eco-immunology. What would that be? How would the practices of ecological and evolutionary sciences connect with those of mainstream immunology today? To put the point another way, what would a practicing immunologist (or laboratory, research group, institute, etc.) have to gain from Tauber's proposed re-drawing of disciplinary territory? The volume posits a disciplinary transformation in theory only.

Third, Tauber deals with topics of great interest to philosophy of biology -- but engages very little with that literature. Questions of biological individuality, dynamical processes, microorganisms, symbiosis, systems biology and complexity are at the center of lively recent debates in philosophy of biology. But Tauber does not mention these debates, and cites only a few of the scholars involved. Notably, Pradeu's work on immune selfhood and biological individuality (2012), which bears on central themes of the book, is relegated to a brief section on successors to Jerne in Chapter 2. The discussion of systems biology in Chapter 6 ignores a decade of published work on philosophy of systems biology, which includes many of the same points made by Tauber (e.g., O'Malley and Dupré 2005, Boogerd et al 2007). The discussions of microorganisms and symbiosis make no mention of O'Malley's Philosophy of Microbiology (2014), the main thesis of which is that attending to the roles of microorganisms is vital for understanding of philosophical issues such as individuality. Examples could be multiplied. Although this book's main claims stress the importance of interaction and context in the eponymous phenomenon, the work itself stands in lonely splendor, leaving connections with other work in philosophy of biology as an exercise for the reader.


Boogerd, F, Bruggeman, F, Hofmeyr, J-H, and Westerhoff, H (eds.) (2007) Systems Biology: Philosophical Foundations. Elsevier.

Fagan, MB (2007) The search for the hematopoietic stem cell: social interaction and epistemic success in immunology. Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences 38: 217-237.

Morgan, M and Morrison, M (eds.) (2000) Models as Mediators. Cambridge University Press.

O'Malley, M (2014) Philosophy of Microbiology. Cambridge University Press.

O'Malley, M, and Dupré, J (2005) Fundamental issues in systems biology. BioEssays 27: 1270-1276.

Podolsky, SH and Tauber, AI (1997) The Generation of Diversity: Clonal Selection Theory and the Rise of Molecular Immunology. Harvard University Press.

Pradeu, T (2012) The Limits of the Self: Immunology and Biological Identity. Oxford University Press, translated by Elizabeth Vitanza.

Tauber, AI (1994) The Immune Self: Theory or Metaphor? Cambridge University Press.

Tauber, AI and Chernyak, L (1991) Metchnikoff and the Origins of Immunology: From Metaphor to Theory.  Oxford University Press.

Winsberg, E (2010) Science in the Age of Computer Simulation. The University of Chicago Press.

[1] A survey of the top-ranked programs in immunology (according to the 2014 US News and World Report survey) reveals no eco-immunology graduate courses or faculty research interests in the top six (Johns Hopkins, UCSF, Harvard, Stanford, Yale, UPenn). These institutions do include courses and research interests indicating connections with computer science, systems biology, epigenetics and genomics. But there is no indication that the top research centers for immunology (at least in the US) have embraced eco-immunology in any major way.  The Society for Integrative and Comparative Biology includes a Division of Ecoimmunology and Disease Ecology, and programs in ecoimmunology are offered at the University of Nevada, Reno, Illinois State, and several other institutions. To be sure, ecoimmunology is a recognized sub-field within immunology.  But it has not had, and does not appear poised to have, a transformative effect on immunology as a whole. (Of course, this does not impugn Tauber’s normative claims about eco-immunology.)

[2] Apologies to W.B. Yeats.

[3] See also remarks on pages 34, 46, 129, and in the preface: “immunity is fundamentally an information-processing faculty” (xii).