Immunity to Error through Misidentification: New Essays

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Simon Prosser and François Recanati (eds.), Immunity to Error through Misidentification: New Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 304pp., $95.00 (hbk), 9780521198301.

Reviewed by Donovan Wishon, University of Mississippi


These thirteen previously unpublished essays on the thesis that some of our judgments exhibit immunity to error through misidentification (henceforth IEM) are by some of the current leading scholars investigating it. Introduced by Sydney Shoemaker ("Self-Reference and Self-Awareness" 1968), the notion of IEM designates the purported special epistemic and/or semantic character of judgments for which we cannot make the following mistake: that our judgment would be true of something, but is nonetheless false because, and only because, we mistakenly take some other object to be it. It is widely held that an understanding of IEM, if there is such a phenomenon, is very important because of the light it promises to shed on such phenomena as self-reference, self-awareness, self-knowledge, and (more contentiously) de se thought in general. So it is somewhat surprising that this is the first collection of essays solely devoted to the issue. As such, there is no question that it is a valuable resource for anyone interested in IEM, especially since the essays are overall of good quality. That said, the volume's value is diminished somewhat by the noticeable absence of essays by some of the leading scholars on the topic. Consequently, it does not adequately capture the full range of distinctive and innovative approaches to current thinking about IEM. This problem can be easily overcome, however, by reading it along with other recent work, which I especially recommend doing in a graduate seminar.[1]

In the opening paper "On the thesis that 'I' is not a referring term", John Campbell argues that in contrast to other referring terms in thought and talk, the pattern of use we make of 'I' is not explained by the way in which it refers to its designated object. In claiming that the pattern of use of a referring term is explained by its reference, Campbell means two things: (1) that the correctness conditions governing the proper use of the term are explained by the way in which the reference is assigned to the term, and (2) that the actual pattern of use we put the term to is causally explained by our understanding of the way in which the reference is assigned to the term (p. 2).[2]

But, he argues, whereas the reference of tokens of 'I' are explained by the token-reflexive rule that "any token of 'I' refers to whoever produced it", the patterns of use of 'I' are explained "by all our narrative of memory, by all of our self-ascriptions of physical and psychological properties, and so on" while giving a central place to "the special concern and connection" each of us has to our self (p. 6 and 18-21). What Campbell takes this to suggest is that the way the reference of 'I' is determined can neither explain its pattern of use, nor why some uses of it in judgments exhibit IEM, while some do not. This, he maintains, is what is right about the well-known Wittgensteinian thesis that 'I' (at least in some uses) is not a referring term.

I am sympathetic with Campbell's claim that our patterns of use of 'I' do not invariably align with the way in which its reference is assigned. However, I remain unconvinced (1) that "the reference of the first person does no work in explaining, causally or normatively, the pattern of use of the term" (p. 21, emphasis mine), and (2) that it is not a key part of the explanation of why some of judgments exhibit IEM relative to the first person. Hence, I simply want to know more about his positive explanation of the pattern of use of 'I'.

In her essay, Annalisa Coliva defends "our commonsensical intuitions that [the self] is identical to a living human being with, intrinsically, physical and psychological properties" against "revisionary" views that either posit a transcendental self, or deny that there is any such thing as a self (p. 22). Following recent work by Christopher Peacocke (1999),Coliva seeks to identify distinctive features of some first-person thoughts, which promote revisionary misconceptions about the self, and to explain their natures and significance. But whereas Peacocke maintains that "representational independence" is the "key to all methodologies" about the self, Coliva is a pluralist about the distinctive features that give rise to "illusions of transcendence" (p. 23-25).[3]

In making her case against Peacocke, Coliva draws on Shoemaker's useful distinction between de facto immunity to error through misidentification and logical IEM. In instances of the former kind, IEM relative to a term is ensured by contingent features of the circumstances of its use, features which might be absent in deviant scenarios. But in instances of the latter kind, the IEM is conceptually ensured by the meaning of the term such that even in deviant scenarios misidentification is (conceptually) impossible. For instance, she argues, judgments of the form "I am the thinker (subject) of this (presently given) thought)" are analytic, a priori, and enjoy logical IEM relative to the first-person pronoun (p. 37-38). But on Peacocke's view, according to which psychological self-ascriptions feature the first-person concept without being grounded in first-person contents, it is unclear how to explain why it is both false and irrational for a subject to judge that "I am not the thinker (subject) of this (presently given) thought".

Coliva's own proposal is that in having conscious thoughts and experiences, a subject is ipso facto non-conceptually and pre-reflectively aware of herself as the subject of the relevant psychological occurrence. What's more, this awareness of the self, which is built into the essential epistemic structure of all conscious thought and experience, is what grounds the logical IEM our judgments exhibit when we make psychological self-ascriptions. In my view, Coliva is taking exactly the right course here. The widespread hesitancy to offer this kind of explanation of the logical IEM of some self-thoughts results, I believe, from the unfounded fear of introducing anything like a Russellian notion of "acquaintance" into the picture, a notion which (due to widespread misunderstandings) is often seen as epistemically and metaphysically suspect.

Marina Folescu and James Higginbotham's "Two takes on the de se" is one of the more technical papers. In it they argue that comparative semantic evidence from English and Romanian shows that there are distinct dimensions or ways in which utterances in particular languages are distinctively de se and can exhibit IEM relative to particular terms. The first way is secured by the cross-reference between a subject's successful use of an appropriate term in the language to refer to herself and her intention to use the term to make self-reference to herself as the subject of that very utterance. The second way is secured by anaphoric cross-reference of embedded reflexive verbs or pronouns either to a subject of the main clause, or to the (specified or unspecified) subject of a subordinate clause in which it is embedded. This second way opens possibilities (1) of de se thoughts or utterances that happen to be about oneself without being explicitly marked as about oneself, and (2) of de se thoughts and utterances where oneself is not the subject of the relevant self-ascriptions. I find the semantic evidence Folescu and Higginbotham point to extremely intriguing, so I was disappointed that they did little to draw out its philosophical significance, particularly with respect to our understanding of IEM.

In "Immunity to error as an artifact of transition between representational media", Jenann Ismael draws on a sophisticated theory of information to argue that IEM relative to the first-person pronoun is a formal result of the transition between representational states whose content is "ego-less" to ones whose content contains explicit (reflexive) representation of the subject of those very representational states. According to Ismael, our experiences are ego-less representational states in the sense that they lack altogether "an argument place for the subject that can take a range of values and that acts as a separate degree of freedom" (p. 74). But when we make judgments of the form "I am in pain", she maintains, we attribute pain "to one person among any number who might have that property" (p. 72). So transitioning from the information represented in having a pain experience to a corresponding judgment requires that a new subject parameter be introduced.

But, Ismael continues, not just any subject can be a value for the newly introduced subject parameter. This is because the subject parameter is articulated by the use of the first-person pronoun 'I' which identifies its value "reflexively as the subject of these very thoughts and experiences" (p. 74). And this explains why in making introspectively-basedjudgments of the form "I am in pain", nothing leaves "room for the possibility that the sufferer may have been misidentified because the sufferer is identified as the subject of [that very] pain" (p. 74). However, I worry that the special features of the pronoun 'I' are doing the real work here in securing IEM, rather than any formal consequence of a transition between representational media.

Béatrice Longuenesse's "Two uses of 'I' as subject?" provides a nice historical exploration of the differences between Wittgenstein's (1933-5) distinction between the use of 'I' "as subject" and the use of 'I' "as object" and Kant's seemingly related distinction between consciousness of oneself "as subject" and consciousness of oneself "as object" (p. 81). She argues that Wittgenstein and Kant highlight two distinct uses of 'I' as subject, both of which exhibit IEM relative to the first-person pronoun, though for quite different reasons.

To help direct our attention to Kant's distinction, she offers an intriguing exposition of Gareth Evans' discussion of "self-identification" in Chapter 7 of his The Varieties of Reference (1982). The view resulting from this discussion, she contends, is that "all I-thoughts [including ones in which 'I' is used as object] are backed by information that, if explicitly formulated, would be formulated in [judgments exhibiting IEM] . . . in which 'I' is used 'as subject'" (p. 88). However, she thinks that this view is mistaken in maintaining that in all self-ascriptions, "the subject of judgment refers to herself as the subject of her judgment only if she is conscious of herself, via specific sources of information, as a spatio-temporal entity" (p. 89).

According to Longuenesse, Evans overlooks Kant's insight that a subject can alternatively use 'I' to think about herself in a way in which "the subject of thought is to herself part of the content of her thought in no other capacity than as the agent of a process of thinking that generates a specific kind of unity of mental contents" (p. 88). Such judgments about oneself, she thinks, exhibit IEM for very different reasons than those recognized by Evans:

It's not that I am predicating a state (the occurrent state of thinking) that is experienced in such a way that there is no room for being justified in asserting of someone but mistaken in this, and this alone, that I am asserting it of myself. Rather, the capacity to think of myself and via the concept and word 'I', and the process of connecting my thoughts and representations in such a way that I can account for my reasons, are mutually conditioning. (p. 92)

Put somewhat differently, the reason why such uses of 'I' exhibit IEM is that 'I' just refers to whatever is the unifying and reason-giving activity of thinking that culminates in judgments I am accountable for. I simply cannot issue and be accountable for an I-thought that requires such a unifying reason-giving process of thought, refer to that very process of thought using 'I', and yet be mistaken about which process of thought is under question (p. 92).

In "Immunity to error through misidentification: what does it tell us about the de se?", Daniel Morgan argues against the general view that IEM is a source of special illumination on the nature of de se thought, taking particular aim at Higginbotham's (2003) and Recanati's (2007) versions of it. On Higginbotham's view, careful reflection on IEM shows that the distinctive feature of de se thought is that it involves thinking about oneself using a special first-person mode of presentation, one which is "reflexive" in the sense that it involves thinking about oneself as the subject of that very thought. On Recanati's view, reflection on IEM shows that the de se thoughts that exhibit it are ones that 'concern' the subject thinking them (i.e., the subject figures into their fully-specified satisfaction conditions) but whose explicit contents contain no identifying mode of presentation of that subject. Morgan's core objection to both Higginbotham and Recanati is that they attempt to explain IEM by means of the contents of our relevant thoughts, rather than by means of the baseson which the thoughts are made (p. 107-109 and 118-119).

Morgan holds that the most plausible explanation of IEM is what he dubs "the Simple Explanation". On the Simple Explanation, a thought exhibits IEM relative to a term just in case the thought does not depend on any belief which identifies its referent, thought of in some particular way, with an object thought of in some other way (p. 118). He contends that

neither Higginbotham's nor Recanati's theory [of IEM] goes beyond [the Simple Explanation] -- neither explains anything the Simple Explanation leaves unexplained. Moreover, the Simple Explanation does not itself rule out any candidate theory of de se thought. (p. 105-106)

Hence, IEM is not explained by, and sheds no special illumination on, the nature of de se thought.

Morgan poses a worthwhile challenge for theorists trying to explain IEM. However, I worry about the adequacy of his own Simple Explanation of IEM. And since my worry bears on a number of related accounts, I will spend a little time articulating it.

At its core, the Simple Explanation maintains that our judgments exhibit IEM relative to some term just in case we do not in fact arrive at them by means of (informative) identity beliefs, the idea being that if we don't rely on any such identity beliefs there is simply no room for having made an error of misidentification. But this strikes me as not really capturing what Shoemaker and others have in mind by IEM. It seems to me that the issue isn't whether one in fact arrives at such judgments by means of (informative) identity beliefs, but whether one could be wrong about which things one made the judgments about (relative to the relevant term) if the question of possible misidentification were so much as raised.

Put slightly differently, the Simple Explanation seemingly shares the spirit of Wittgensteinian views about IEM in at least this respect: if a judgment in no way depends on an identity belief, then it exhibits IEM simply because there is no sense in so much as raising questions about misidentification (or identification for that matter). But as I understand it, Shoemaker is not interested in IEM as a phenomenon that arises for judgments concerning which the question of identification or misidentification makes no sense, is ill-formed, or is unaskable. Rather, he is concerned with investigating the special nature of the expressions used in making certain judgments regarding which questions of identification and misidentification are perfectly intelligible, and yet the subject making them is safeguarded from arriving at the wrong answers to any such challenges. So my worry is that however plausible Morgan's Simple Explanation is in accounting for the phenomenon he identifies as IEM, he has simply missed the mark regarding the phenomenon which interests Shoemaker, Higginbotham, Recanati, and others.[4]

In "Action and immunity to error through misidentification", Lucy O'Brien makes a similar case that IEM, at least of a strong kind, cannot serve as a source of genuine illumination for an immediately adjacent philosophical topic. More specifically, she argues that a subject's self-knowledge of her actions is not to be explained in terms of agents' awareness grounding "a kind of immunity to error that bodily awareness does not" (p. 124). In fact, she argues, "if we hold that a subject's knowledge of her actions is essentially first-personal, in a way that a subject's knowledge of her body through bodily awareness might not be, then we are better off arguing for that claim directly" (p. 124).

As O'Brien notes, this position is a departure from her earlier (2007) view that "judgments made on the basis of agents' awareness are transparently immune to error in a way that those made on the basis of bodily awareness are not" and that "such stronger, transparent, immunity [is] a marker for its suitability as a source of self-knowledge" (p. 124-5).[5] The idea behind this earlier view was that even if "cross-wiring cases" were possible, they would only raise an open question about whether bodily awareness provides a subject with information about her own body, rather than another's.[6] They would not, however, provide a subject with sufficient grounds for knowledge that someone produced an action while leaving open who did. Hence, the argument ran, agents' awareness provides secure self-knowledge, whereas bodily awareness provides only de facto knowledge of the subject's body.

O'Brien spends much of her paper advancing reasons for questioning two of the assumptions on which her earlier view rests: (i) that the information provided through the cross-wire link would not indicate whether bodily movements are active or passive, and (ii) that transparent IEM can serve as a suitable marker of self-knowledge.[7] However, I found more interesting her discussion of two different issues -- concerning whether agents' awareness is necessarily first-personal -- at the end of the paper. First, she points out that the identity conditions of an action are seemingly not independent of the identification of whose actions they are; "which subject's actions they are depends on whose reasons, desires and so on are the direct determinants of the action", despite how the action is presented to her (p. 142).[8] Second, she contends that an agent's awareness is seemingly highly sensitive to whether a subject experiences an action as being directly determined by her own plans, desires, decisions, and reasoning.

Regarding this second issue, I have the worry (the force of which many admittedly won't feel) that if a subject's experience as of an action being directly determined by his or her own thinking is not an exceptionless guide to its being the case that an action is so determined by his or her own thinking, then it is unclear that the revised understanding of agents' awareness fares any better in securing self-knowledge than the earlier version.

In "Explaining de se phenomena", Christopher Peacocke contends that IEM is a phenomenon distinctive of the first-person concept I (and presumably of de se concepts generally) and so an explanation of the former must draw on a theory of the latter (p. 144). According to Peacocke, IEM is best characterized in the following way (which echoes Morgan's Simple Explanation):

the thinker's judgment I'm F is immune to error through misidentification when reached in way W if there is no individual concept m distinct from I such that the thinker, in reaching the judgment in way W, relies on the thinker's identity belief I = m. Then, when mistakes about which thing is F are really possible, that will be so because it is a real nearby possibility that the thinker's identity belief I = m is false. (p. 147)

He also maintains that the first-person concept is individuated by the fundamental reference rule that "what makes someone the reference of I in a thinking is that he or she is the producer of that thinking" (p. 145). Putting these ideas together, his proposal is that we must draw on the fundamental reference rule of I to explain why it is that judgments exhibiting IEM are ones that are reached without depending on any belief which identifies the subject, thought of under the first-person concept, with someone (perhaps the subject) thought of under another concept.

Unfortunately, while Peacocke offers examples of judgments exhibiting IEM that don't depend on identity beliefs, as well as judgments not exhibiting IEM that do, he does little to spell out in any detail how the fundamental reference rule helps explain IEM. It is not enough to assure us that there must be some such explanation since "it seems impossible to fill in any detail" concerning the possibility of uses of our first-person concept which lack IEM (p. 147).[9] At best, we would have enough evidence to conclude that IEM and the first-person concept necessarily go hand-in-hand, not that the former is explained by the latter. So while Peacocke's proposal is intriguing, it leaves us in the unsatisfying position of wanting to hear more.

Simon Prosser's "Sources of immunity to error through misidentification" is one of the more helpful papers for getting clear about what error through misidentification is, and how it differs from other related errors with which one might confuse it. Prosser begins with his contention that a correct account of IEM in indexical judgments likely requires distinguishing between the stated belief and the manifested belief a subject has when sincerely expressing a belief with an utterance of the form 'λ is F', where 'λ' is an indexical expression (p. 158). In such a case, the subject has a stated belief, of the object referred to by 'λ', that it has the property F. But the subject also has a manifested belief, articulated or not, that his or her use of 'λ' in the utterance stands in a particular relation to the object to which it refers.[10] According to Prosser, errors through misidentification (EM) happen when the object which is the source of information that leads the subject to apply the predicate F in an utterance of the form 'λ is F' differs from the object which in fact is referred to by 'λ' (p. 161). Such errors are to be distinguished from errors through misclassification (EMC) in which the subject's manifested belief about the relation his or her use of 'λ' bears to its referent is false.

Prosser then characterizes the IEM exhibited by certain indexical judgments as the result of the impossibility, whether logical or de facto, of the source object and target object of a subject's stated belief differing (p. 163).[11] He argues that there are at least two ways to secure this. One is if the very same perceptually-based information about an object both provides the grounds for a predication and is exploited in identifying that object. Another way is if a subject stipulates a nominal term to stand for whatever reliably provides information, through particular standard channels, that a predicate 'is F' is instantiated (p. 176-9). This distinction strikes me as both useful and plausible.

In "Immunity to error through misidentification: what it is and where it comes from", François Recanati offers a revision and defense of his explanation of IEM in Perspectival Thought (2007). Some of the claims on which this earlier view rested include: (1) that we need to distinguish the content of an experience from its mode, (2) that the mode of an experience fixes the situation with respect to which the content of the experience is to be evaluated, and (3) that these modes draw from situations of evaluation unarticulated constituents that figure in the primary judgments the experience gives rise to.[12] Recanati then argued that IEM is a distinguishing feature of de se thoughts in which the thinking subject is an implicit unarticulated constituent of their contents. The basic idea was that if the self was not represented in the explicit content of a de se judgment, but only figured into the situation of evaluation, there would be no possibility of misrepresenting the self.[13]

The main shift Recanati makes is accepting that it is possible to make de se judgments exhibiting IEM in which the self is represented in their explicit contents. They do so, however, only if the following condition is met: that they are appropriately based on experiences that do not explicitly feature their experiencing subjects in their contents, yet nevertheless implicitly feature them as unarticulated constituents within their situations of evaluation. Such de se judgments are appropriately based on experiences with the relevant features when they are made by means of indexical concepts that exploit the contextual relations these experiences bear to their experiencing subjects. Recanati argues that roughly the same story can explain those demonstrative judgments that exhibit IEM. The only required change is that the judgments must be appropriately based on experiences the contents of which are determined by their subjects' acts of selective attention.[14]

I have a great deal of sympathy with Recanati's new view. Nevertheless, I suspect that what is doing the real work in securing the IEM of de se judgments (regardless of whether the subject figures explicitly or implicitly in their contents) is that they are made by exploiting, in the right way, what Recanati elsewhere (2010) calls "epistemically rewarding [contextual] relations". Hence, I would have liked to have seen this notion take center stage in his new account of IEM.

In "I and I: immunity to error through misidentification of the subject", Galen Strawson probes the intimate connections between the phenomenon of IEM, the special features of 'I' when used in self-thought and self-reference, and the fundamental nature of subjects of experience (and their relations to whole persisting human beings).[15] In the course of doing so, he characteristically makes a number of claims that, for better or worse, many contemporary philosophers would see as fairly radical.[16] One such claim is that selves are not strictly speaking the same things as persisting human beings. Rather they are fairly short-lived, spatio-temporal parts of whole human beings -- they are subjects of experience which are numerically identical to the activity of experience occurring within a human being at some particular time, and thus only persist for the duration of that particular episode (p. 208-209). Strawson further claims that the reference of a subject's use of the expression 'I' (or its corresponding thought-element) regularly shifts between the whole human being and the temporary subject of experience within it, depending on the context and on the often unreflective semantic intentions of the user (p. 206-207). Nevertheless, he maintains, wheneverone (taken either as a whole person or as a temporary subject of experience) uses 'I' in thought or talk to refer to oneself as oneself, this use exhibits IEM relative to the first-person pronoun (p. 216-217).

I am in complete agreement with Strawson's discussion of IEM, and I simply do not have space here to evaluate Strawson's metaphysical claims. However, I do wonder why, given some of his other commitments, he is so set on holding that "the reference of I doesn't expand and contract in a continuous fashion, like that of now and here . . . [but rather] moves between two fixed positions" (p. 207-208). After all, he takes it that non-philosophers sometimes use I in ways which seemingly accord with it referring to different things (whole persons versus nested temporary selves), which constitutes plausible evidence that I has two fixed meanings. But there is arguably an equally good case to be made that non-philosophers sometimes use I in ways that at least superficially seem to refer to 'things of varying temporal extent' in different contexts -- for instance when saying things like "I'm not the same person as that guy/girl (at such-and-such time) anymore" in one context while identifying themselves with the same earlier person in other contexts.

So if any sense can be made of different 'selves' being temporally nested as parts within 'whole persons' of varying temporal extents, why not hold that the reference of I, at least in some uses, expands and contracts in a more-or-less continuous fashion? At first glance, it seems to accord with non-philosophical uses of I at least as well as his proposal. So if non-philosophical uses of I are (defeasible) evidence for the one view, why put on the brakes when it comes to the other? It seems to me that either Strawson should not rest his view so comfortably on non-philosophical uses of I, or he should ride them as far as they will go (so long as the metaphysical views implied are in any way defensible).[17]

In my opinion, Frédérique de Vignemont's "Bodily immunity to error" is one of the volume's must-reads. In her paper, de Vignemont surveys a wide swath of recent empirical research which prima facie seems to threaten the view that certain judgments subjects make about their own bodies, on the basis of information gained "from the inside", exhibit (de facto) IEM (p. 224). Included in this body of empirical research are recent investigations of somatoparaphrenia, depersonalization disorder, peripheral deafferentation, body integrity identity disorder, rubber hand illusions, out-of-the-body illusions, body-swapping illusions, proprioceptive drift, and multimodal integration. However, De Vignemont makes a fairly compelling case that nothing in this body of research provides a fatal objection to the thesis of (de facto) bodily IEM. She argues that many of the alleged counterexamples to bodily IEM involve false negative errors of misidentification: errors in which "one does not self-ascribe properties that are instantiated in one's own body" (p. 229). But, she contends, the hypothesis of bodily IEM only concerns false positive errors: ones in which "one self-ascribes properties that are instantiated by another individual's body" (p. 229).

Furthermore, the remaining alleged counterexamples merely "invite us to offer a finer-grained analysis of the grounds that are appropriate for bodily IEM" (p. 246). For instance, DeVignemont argues, while visuo-proprioceptive integration-based judgments allow for errors of misidentification of the body when the visual experiences represent the environment from an egocentric or allocentric frame of reference, such judgments exhibit bodily IEM when the visual experiences represent from the "self-specific visuo-spatial perspective" (p. 241). One such example is when visual-experiences represent the subject's nose as being at a location and with an angle such that it is anatomically guaranteed that it is the subject's own nose. In such cases, the subject's visuo-proprioceptive integration-based judgments about his or her nose will exhibit (de facto) bodily IEM (p. 243).

In "Reflections on François Recanati's 'Immunity to error through misidentification: what it is and where it comes from'", Crispin Wright wants to defend, partly by way of clarification and qualification, what he calls "the Simple Account" of IEM, according to which "IEM is a phenomenon of singular judgment in which no significant identification, associating one singular mode of presentation with another, features as part of the grounds [of the judgment]" (p. 255). As with Morgan's Simple Explanation, Wright's Simple Account aims at liberating "us from any need for metaphysical or semantic extravagance" of the sort involved, for instance, in Recanati's new account of IEM (255).

Wright's Simple Account offers a few key developments to views such as Morgans'. First, he points out (following Recanati) that some inferentially-based judgments exhibit IEM relative to a term because they "inherit" it, in the right way, from non-inferential judgments which are part of their underlying "justificational architectures" (p. 260-262, 273).[18] Second, Wright notes that some non-inferential judgments lack IEM not because they involve an actual (informative) identity belief as part of their grounds, but rather because they rest on implicit (defeasible) presuppositions of (informative) identity (p. 267-271). Third, he argues that the aforementioned points about IEM can be extended to explain singular judgments or avowals that are (allegedly) immune to error through mispredication. According to Wright, a judgment of this kind is one in which "the predication it involves neither is defeasibly grounded in a parent predication . . . nor rests upon it as a presupposition" (p. 279).

I'm inclined to think that Wright's first two extensions are quite plausible while his third is considerably less so. Unfortunately, I lack the space here to take on such a big issue.[19] Thus, I will simply note that it is unclear that his clarifications and qualifications help to mitigate the biggest worry I have about this kind of view: that it simply tries to explain a phenomenon different from the one that seemingly interests Shoemaker, Recanati, and others. I say this, however, recognizing full-well that the far more interesting issue is whether Wright gives a satisfactory account of the phenomenon he identifies as IEM.

Prosser and Recanati have assembled an important and interesting collection of papers on immunity to error through misidentification. Despite my worries concerning some of the views advanced in it (and concerning some of the lamentable omissions), I see it playing a driving role in discussions of IEM for years to come.


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Recanati, François (2010). "Singular Thought: In Defense of Acquaintance." New Essays on Singular Thought, Robin Jeshion (ed.). Oxford University Press.

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Strawson, Galen (2010). "The Minimal Self." The Oxford Handbook of the Self, Shaun Gallagher (ed.). Oxford University Press.

Wishon, Donovan (2012). Russellian Acquaintance and Phenomenal Concepts. Doctoral Dissertation. Stanford University.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig (1933-5/1958). The Blue and Brown Books. Oxford: Blackwell Publishing.

[1] Some notable examples of what I have in mind include papers by Shoemaker, Perry, and Rosenthal in Consciousness and the Self: New Essays (2012), by Cassam, Shoemaker, and Perry in The Oxford Handbook to the Self (2011), and by Gallagher, Feit, and Grünbaum in Consciousness and Subjectivity (2012).

[2] Note that Campbell himself says that the patterns of use of referring terms (other than 'I') are causally sustained by our knowledge of reference. However, this stronger claim seems to demand too much, epistemically speaking, of competent members of a linguistic community, and would also seem to leave little room for widespread patterns of misuse of referring terms.

[3] "Representational independence" is glossed as the alleged fact that psychological self-ascriptions feature the first-person concept without being grounded in first-personal contents.

[4] Incidentally, it would also go to show that at least some judgments do not exhibit IEM relative to the term 'IEM'. It would also help explain why theorists often seem (at least to me) to be talking past one another regarding IEM.

[5] O'Brien glosses the distinction between non-transparent IEM and transparent IEM as the distinction between " (i) its being impossible to have existential knowledge, via a given source, that some property is satisfied, without it also being true that I have that property and (ii) its being impossible to have existential knowledge, via a given source, that some property is satisfied, without my knowing that I have that property" (p. 125).

[6] "Cross-wiring cases" are ones in which a subject is knowingly linked to someone else's body such that the information she receives from it is phenomenologicallyindistinguishable from the information she receives from bodily awareness.

[7] She questions the first assumption by appealing to psychological evidence that suggests that subjects can reliably distinguish between active and passive movements. She questions the second assumption on the grounds that transparent IEM would only be a clear marker of self-knowledge provided that the unwarranted assumptions that "the methodused to ground the existential claim 'Someone is undergoing E' must be transparent to the subject" or that "the content used to ground existential claims . . . must be transparent to the subject with respect to whether it is first personal" (p. 134).

[8] This thought strikes me as very much in line with Longuenesse's earlier discussion of Kant.

[9] I pass over Peacocke's extensive criticisms of John Perry's recent work on de se thought and IEM largely because he has many misconceptions about it. In my view, Perry's work actually shares much of the spirit of Peacocke's proposal, while at the same time providing useful materials for explaining IEM, de se thought, and their relationship to one another.

[10] Following Korta and Perry (2011) and Perry (2012) we might alternatively hold that the subject has a single belief with both stated and unstated contents.

[11] He characterizes IEMC similarly as the impossibility of 'λ' not bearing the right relation to its referent in his or her manifested belief.

[12] I am ignoring that these primary judgments have two layers of content: its lekton (or explicit narrow content) and its implicit broader 'Austinian' content, which includes both explicit narrow content and the situation of evaluation determined by the mode of the experience on which the primary judgment is made. In my opinion, this distinction is relatively inessential for understanding Recanati's views concerning IEM.

[13] This kind of account of IEM seemingly raises the same basic concern noted above regarding Morgan's Simple Explanation.

[14] I am once again glossing over a finer distinction Recanati makes: that between explicit and implicit demonstrative judgments.

[15] For fuller recent discussions of these topics, see Strawson (2009) and (2010).

[16] It goes without saying that whether a claim is radical or not is logically independent of whether or not it is true, or whether or not it is well-supported by argument. For that reason, I hereby cancel any implicature that I am making any such assessments of Strawson's claims.

[17] It should be obvious that I am not taking a stand one way or the other here about the defensibility of the metaphysical view implied by my hypothetical alternative to Strawson'sview. While I think such a view (which I elsewhere call the Stretch Theory of persistence) is worthy of further theoretical investigation, it is far less clear to me that it has any real chance of being true. In any case, I certainly think that we must be extremely cautious in deriving metaphysical conclusions from the linguistic evidence, including evidence regarding the ordinary use of a term.

[18] For Recanati's discussion of inferentially-based thoughts that exhibit IEM, see pages 182-184.

[19] The crux of my worry is that the class of avowals that are immune to error through mispredication, if there is one, is far more restricted than Wright, along with many others,thinks. In particular, I believe that Wright is mistaken in holding that our "predications of mental states that are individuated by their phenomenal character" are immune to error through mispredication (p. 279), despite a long tradition and entrenched intuitions to the contrary. In saying this, I am not questioning whether such judgments exhibit immunity to reference failure or a particular kind of IEM. Rather, I am simply claiming that, however reliable they might be, none of our judgments about phenomenal experience are immune to error through mispredication (aside perhaps from those concerning their existence). It is a pervasive myth that our knowledge of our own conscious experience is in any way transparent, revelatory, or infallible. Among other things, my dissertation Russellian Acquaintance and Phenomenal Concepts (2012) makes just this case by drawing on important (and long overlooked) insights of Bertrand Russell , in Our Knowledge of the External World (1914) and elsewhere, about what phenomenal continua cases and other cases of introspective error show about the nature of acquaintance. I further pursue these issues in a number of papers that are currently under review and in-progress.