Impassioned Belief

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Michael Ridge, Impassioned Belief, Oxford University Press, 2014, 264pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199682669.

Reviewed by Andrew Alwood, Virginia Commonwealth University


This book is the latest to explore the metaethical aims of the expressivist quasi-realism pioneered by Simon Blackburn and Allan Gibbard. Michael Ridge broaches an impressive range of topics involving language, thought, motivation, rationality, and disagreement, in order to defend Ecumenical Expressivism (EE), a sophisticated view about normative meanings.

The basic aim for EE is to merge the advantages of what appears to be diametrically opposed theories: descriptivist realism and expressivist antirealism. Ridge appeals to the resources of descriptivists in outlining normative meanings -- there are normative propositions, normative truth, and extensions for normative predicates. But he self-consciously works to "earn the right" to such notions, so that he can use them without incurring the allegedly burdensome metaphysical and epistemological commitments imposed by realism. In this way, Ridge aspires for EE to do just as well or better than traditional descriptivist-realists at handling the issues that seem most difficult for antirealism -- issues involving normative logic, truth, rational inference, embedding, mind-independence, etc. But he also aspires for EE to have every advantage of expressivism, and without inheriting the problems of either view.

Although Ridge overtly aspires to collapse the false dichotomy in metaethical debates, going "Ecumenical" is not about reconciliation; it is about take-over. The goal is to undermine normative realist theories by appropriating and modifying the main ideas of descriptivist semantic theories to fit them with normative antirealism.

Ridge isn't a "queasy" realist, as some wonder about quasi-realists more generally. His most obvious commitment is to eschew the notion of normative representation. But his semantics looks every bit like descriptivism. Perhaps a better moniker would be 'quasi-descriptivism', since Ridge's fashioning of the quasi-realist program apparently concedes descriptivism at the level of (first-order) semantics while refocusing its aims and ambitions on the level of metasemantics, as I'll explain.

There are actually two different projects involved with going "Ecumenical." First, there is the move to a hybrid version of expressivism, on which both beliefs and desires are expressed by what he calls "normative claims." Ridge assumes an agent inhabits a single action-guiding "normative perspective" which combines with (and partly determines the content of) a belief so that the pair of attitudes together constitute a normative judgment. The content of the belief doesn't reference normative features of the world. It only references "standards" that are compatible with the normative perspective.

Second, there is the move to go metasemantic. Ridge tailors his expressivist theses as claims not about the semantics but instead about the metasemantics of normative claims. He explains the difference between semantics and metasemantics much like one would distinguish ethics and metaethics. First-order semantics "assigns literal meanings ('semantic contents') to meaningful units of language. Meta-semantics, by contrast, explains that in virtue of which a given word, morpheme, or sentence has the meaning it does" (8). Metasemantics is thus second-order semantics, addressing questions about what semantic contents are and how they come to be associated with bits of language (by convention).

I'm going to briefly summarize Ridge's first-order semantics and then focus attention on clarifying the different moves to go hybrid and metasemantic. This will lead me to raise some questions about exactly how these moves are supposed to change the debate.

In chapter 1, Ridge outlines his first-order semantics for 'good', 'must', 'ought', and 'reason'. He does this by specifying their semantic contents, and later tries to earn the right to speak of these semantic contents as normative propositions and truth-conditions. Actually, it is only certain uses of those words that, with help from context, express "normative claims". What kind of use is relevant? Ridge focuses on the practically normative claims that figure in settling what to do, or which at least contribute to the settling of what to do (18).

The basic framework for paraphrasing the meanings of these normative claims ('x is good', 'x must be done', etc.) is a kind of context-sensitive semantic schema: Any acceptable standard of practical reasoning would rank x sufficiently highly (p. 36, my paraphrase). Context is supposed to provide several important parts to this schema and to any completed instance of it. Saying x is a 'reason' only needs for a standard to give x "positive weight", while 'ought' needs for a standard to "recommend" x, and 'must' needs for a standard to "require" x. (A natural question to ask here is: what is it for a standard to recommend, require, or assign weight? Ridge never gives a full answer explicitly, but when we later learn that standards are just a type of mental act, perhaps we should infer that such talk reduces to thinkers performing acts of recommending, requiring, etc.)

For Ridge, 'acceptable' is the fundamental normative notion, and he claims that any metaethical debate can be recast "as a debate about the meta-semantics for claims about what any such acceptable standards would be like" (10). For example, someone might propose that 'acceptable' refers to a non-natural property. Ridge unsurprisingly takes it to have a nonrepresentational function involved with practical reasoning: "to decide a course of action is acceptable in a given set of circumstances is in some sense to decide that the course of action is not ruled out for purposes of your deliberation -- that it is still 'on the table'" (41).

Ridge intends that as a claim about the metasemantics of 'acceptable'. But why isn't it instead a first-order claim about its semantic meaning? What does 'acceptable' contribute to the meanings of the sentences he uses to specify the semantic contents of normative claims? Ridge says it contributes an extension, just like any predicate: "the extension of all and only the acceptable objects of evaluation" (41).

At this point, it is natural to feel puzzled about whether Ridge is fully going in for truth-conditional, propositional, descriptivist semantics, or whether he is somehow holding out. But as I suggested, I believe he wants to go fully in for descriptivism at the level of first-order semantics, and back it up with a metasemantic theory on which descriptivist notions like propositions, truth and predicate-extensions are not representational. This raises interesting issues about normative propositions (ch. 4) and normative truth (ch. 7), to which I now turn.

Ridge thinks that attributions of truth are themselves normative judgments: "judgments about truth do have as their primary function settling on the thing to think." Similarly, "talk of (a predicate's) extension will also turn out to be normative talk" (212). As I understand him, Ridge wants to assign extensions to predicates relative to a normative perspective. So, perhaps it would be better for Ridge to advertise EE as the combination of relativist descriptivism for first-order semantics with a second-order metasemantics of expressivism. Or, this might indicate a tension in how Ridge wants to develop EE. In his handling of normative disagreement, for example, he seems to waver between two theories: one that seems more prescriptivist in ch. 6 and another more relativist in ch. 7.

Ridge considers an argument from Mark Schroeder that expressivism is incompatible with truth-conditional semantics, since it prevents truth from doing serious explanatory work in a theory of meaning (106). Ridge responds that EE can reject deflationism about truth and thus avoid the objection. Since EE allows there to be representational contents involved with (the belief component of) normative judgments, it can employ a representational conception of truth, such as correspondence theories, to do semantic work, including responding to the Frege-Geach problem where he "offloads" explanations of embedding, validity, and rational inference to the representational contents (ch. 5).

This is a point at which we should clarify the commitments of EE. Although Ridge does eventually want to talk of normative propositions and normative truth, as part of his move to go metasemantic, they don't have any clear role to play in EE's fundamental semantic explanations. The semantic explanations of embedding, validity, and related issues are instead afforded by the move to go hybrid. This is what allows EE to exploit nonnormative representational contents, and this substantially changes what is at issue in expressivist embedding.

For instance, consider negation. By going hybrid, Ridge effectively avoids answering the most difficult questions about expressivist negation. What does it mean to negate a nonrepresentational meaning? Ridge doesn't say, since his account of external negation and all other forms of embedding just drive the relevant operators into the representational content of the belief involved with normative judgments. Saying something is not good, where 'not' scopes over 'good', is to say that any acceptable standard of practical reasoning would not rank it highly. Notice that the occurrence of 'not' in Ridge's paraphrase is inside of the quantificational phrase where the nonrepresentational term 'acceptable' occurs. Negation is thus exactly the same for EE as it is for a descriptivist. Going hybrid changes what's of interest about embedding normative claims in complex constructions, as EE makes heavy use of descriptivist materials to explain semantic composition while trying its best to make the nonrepresentational meaning just stay out of the way.

The move to go hybrid is itself compatible with offering a first-order semantics of attitudes, such as that attempted by Schroeder's Being For (OUP, 2008) on which the compositional ingredients of a complex sentence are the attitudes expressed by the clauses. But Ridge apparently wants to avoid embracing a first-order semantics of attitudes. He instead claims that EE has the advantage of being "entirely compatible with the orthodox formal approaches to first-order semantics in linguistics" (132). This is where the move to go metasemantic is supposed to help, since EE is designed to be a metasemantic theory about first-order descriptive materials such as normative propositions. The advantage of being compatible with orthodox semantic approaches that use propositions is thus to be achieved with an unorthodox conception of propositions.

What are normative propositions according to EE? The view, roughly put, is that normative propositions are types of mental events. Here Ridge borrows a theory of propositions from Scott Soames in order to avoid the result that normative propositions are representational. On Soames' view, no propositions are intrinsically or fundamentally representational; propositions are really just types of cognitive events of the form entertaining that p. That is, Soames proposes to reverse the usual order of explanation: our states of mind don't represent that p in virtue of relating us to an intrinsically representational object of thought, the proposition that p, but rather propositions derive from token acts of (mentally) representing. Ridge adds that, in addition to the cognitive event-types such as entertaining that this is red, which are derivatively representational by being types of token mental acts of representing, there are also non-cognitive event-types like deciding to take a swim, which are not representational at all. Ridge equates his "standards", ubiquitous in his first-order semantics, with such non-cognitive event-types, and he identifies the state of mind of merely entertaining a normative proposition with merely simulating a normative perspective while believing something about how it would apply in some envisioned circumstances (128-29).

This theory of propositions is supposed to help EE develop expressivism as "a meta-semantic view which is compatible with a broadly truth-conditional approach to first-order semantics" (105). As I mentioned, Ridge apparently wants to avoid the idea of expressivism as a semantics of attitudes, and instead say that meanings are semantic contents, understood as propositions and the truth-conditions they determine, rather than mental attitudes. Yet here the identification of propositions with mental events might be an obstacle. That would seem to imply that Ridge's semantic contents are fundamentally mental, and so perhaps he is committed to a semantics of attitudes (mental events) despite his attempt to avoid it. Perhaps his theory of propositions gets in the way of his metasemantic story rather than complementing it, as he seems to think (131).

The metasemantic theory of EE is supposed to be a version of the Gricean project of reducing literal meaning to speaker psychologies. Ridge calls this Ideationalism, and it is here that the expressivist dictum (that a sentence's meaning is explained by the state of mind it expresses) is to be cashed out. A sentence expresses a state of mind, on Ridge's preferred definition for 'express', just in case linguistic conventions dictate that anyone asserting the sentence is thereby liable to be in that state of mind (109). (He credits the assertability semantics of Schroeder 2008, ch. 2, for being a similar view.)

Where does this leave the debate over expressivism? It is not obvious that philosophers who feel opposed to expressivism should be opposed to Ideationalist metasemantics. In fact, Ideationalism is itself sometimes called our closest thing to an orthodox metasemantic theory (Speaks 2014, sec. 3). In redrawing the lines of the debate, Ridge changes what we might have found disagreeable in expressivism. Some will disagree with EE because they think propositions are intrinsically representational, but that doesn't seem like a metaethical dispute so much as a linguistic or (meta-)semantic dispute. Others might agree with an Ideationalist metasemantics and a Soames-style theory of propositions, and yet maintain that the mental event-types that constitute normative propositions are cognitive events. But that sounds exactly like the familiar dispute between cognitivists and noncognitivists about whether normative mental states are beliefs. So, it may seem unclear how the metaethical debate has changed by moving to the level of metasemantics.

But it isn't a bad thing that new questions are raised, and this is a major part of the interest in this book. Ridge's discussion is remarkable for the broad range of topics addressed and the creative and sophisticated positions outlined. His philosophical temperament is syncretistic: his views often seem to absorb key features of the views he opposes. Of course, quasi-realists have been mimicking their opponents for as long as it has been around -- that's kind of the point. But Ridge pushes even further to clarify new lines of debate and find new ways to subtly distinguish his views against those of his opponents.

My focus on the semantic and metasemantic portions of this book has forced me to ignore many other issues of interest such as how normative judgments motivate, how rationality fails to be normative even while truth comes out as normative, and how disagreement might be understood in terms of prescriptions or instead in terms of assessment-sensitivity. All of these topics are worthy of further scrutiny, and so I heartily recommend this book to anyone interested in the prospects of expressivism, whether for or against.


Schroeder, Mark 2008. Being For, Oxford University Press.

Speaks, Jeff 2014. "Theories of Meaning", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2014 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).