Imperfect Oracle: The Epistemic and Moral Authority of Science

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Theodore L. Brown, Imperfect Oracle: The Epistemic and Moral Authority of Science, Penn State Press, 2009, 333 pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271035352.

Reviewed by Steve Fuller, University of Warwick



Theodore Brown is the ultimate academic all-rounder. A distinguished research chemist, author of a best-selling chemistry textbook, founding director of what is arguably America’s leading research unit that actually lives up to its ‘interdisciplinary’ remit (University of Illinois’ Beckman Institute), a vice chancellor for research and the author of a respectable, liberal-minded book on metaphor as the lifeblood of scientific creativity (Brown 2003). In fact, were it not for his apparent lack of interest in geopolitical manoeuvring, Brown’s career might be comparable to that of another indefatigable 20th century American chemist, James Bryant Conant, the mentor of Thomas Kuhn.

But as readers of this journal would have asked of Conant, how is Brown as a philosopher? Whatever verdict one wishes to deliver on Conant as a philosopher of science, it is clear that he treated the positivist and pragmatist philosophies of his day more as inputs than authorities. Thus, Conant freely picked and mixed what he needed from them to clarify and justify the benevolent but elite role that he would have science play in the Cold War era. In contrast, Brown appears to be only as good as the intellectual agents he works with. Consequently, there are few interesting emergent properties from their combination. Brown’s deferential approach means that his book could be easily mistaken for a lightly revised Ph.D. thesis by an above average student of naturalised analytic philosophy. Put a bit more positively, while this book is priced as if it were a specialist monograph, it could have been marketed in paperback as an introductory textbook in applied epistemology and ethics of contemporary science.

To his credit, Brown begins by asking some of the right questions about the foundations of science’s epistemic and moral authority. Unfortunately he fails to see the need to range far beyond the precincts of contemporary analytic epistemology and constructivist sociology of science into the heart of political theory. Two of Brown’s questions that demand more adventurous political treatment stand out:

1. How does science manage to exert authority in society without having to rely on coercion for its enforcement? This is not to say that politicians, not to mention ordinary folks, sometimes act and speak in defiance of received scientific wisdom, but in those cases a presumption of irrationality hangs over them, which then effectively circumscribes their authority. Moreover, it is not to deny that bad policies have been made with science’s authority. However, the policymakers are usually dealt with much more roughly than the scientists they listened to. Before the globalisation of science, only the established churches in particular nation-states had exerted authority in just this way.

2. How does science manage to sustain its authority over so many matters while remaining so restrictive over who can exert such authority? This is what sociologists after Thomas Gieryn call science’s ‘boundary maintenance’ problem. The Protestant reformers originally drew attention to a problem of this sort vis-à-vis the authority exerted by the Church of Rome over Christendom. They pointed to the tension between a self-avowed ‘universal church’ of notionally equal believers whose secular and spiritual probity is nevertheless routinely vetted by an expert clerical class. As more people became capable of evaluating clerical judgements for themselves — via mass literacy and Biblical criticism — it became increasingly difficult to close ranks against heretics, who in many cases split to form alternative churches. Science’s boundary maintenance is undergoing a similar challenge in our own time. Here the internet corresponds to the printing press, and the result is what Fuller (2010) refers to as ‘Protscience’.

Brown rightly sees science’s epistemic and moral authority as mutually implicated via the concept of autonomy, though his take on this concept — due to Michael Polanyi, Robert Merton and Gerald Holton — leaves much to be desired. In particular, Brown supposes that the matters on which scientists are most likely to be in agreement correspond to some epistemically and morally relevant sense of ‘science’ as a sphere of social life that can be neatly demarcated from, say, politics or religion. However, this view is undermined by a centrepiece of Brown’s own analysis: the US Supreme Court case of Daubert v. Merrell Dow (1993). Credible scientific witnesses were to be found on both sides of this so-called ‘toxic tort’ case, leading the justices to draft guidelines for the assessment of scientific testimony. They basically settled for a snapshot view of the aggregate drift of researcher opinion at the moment of decision, underscoring that future research may force the ruling to be re-examined and even overturned. While the subsequent legal debate has focussed mainly on, so to speak, how to take the snapshot of the relevant science, Daubert conceded that the locus of autonomy of science ultimately resides in individual scientists, each of whom follows the path of inquiry wherever it leads, the overall result of which presumptively passes for a ‘scientific consensus’ at any given time.

Unfortunately most accounts of a normatively binding scientific consensus presuppose a more robust sociology than the statistical drift of scientists’ allegiances. Indeed, despite the frequently repeated claims that scientists constitute a kind of universal polity, tight-knit guild, socially responsible institution and/or efficient division of labour, it is striking that there is no worldwide scientific labour union, political party or even code of ethics. Moreover, it has not been from lack of trying. (Here we might turn to the glorious failure of John Desmond Bernal in the UK and his slightly more successful American follower, Barry Commoner.) In this respect, most social epistemologies of science follow the rhetorical strategy, popularised by Popper, of depicting the normative structure of science as a successful microcosm of the regime that the philosopher would like to see govern society as a whole.

For example, Brown is attracted to Philip Kitcher (1993), who proposed a market signalling model of scientific authority, which presumes that scientists constitute a self-organizing learning society from which over time patterns of expertise and trust emerge, on the model of traders whose technical and communicative skills are mutually honed by discovering the sorts of things that they can do best for themselves and are best left to be done by others. From this Smithian premise supposedly arises a rational division of cognitive labour in society. Brown appears to believe that this basic model could work to capture the relations of authority that science exerts both internally and externally in society. And such a model would make good sense if scientific authority were based exclusively on scientists’ technical skills, as, say, one decides who is most likely to fix the plumbing. Successful plumbers know the limits of their skills, there is agreement amongst plumbers about those limits and they are advertised. These facts contribute to plumbers thriving in a classic market economy of the sort that Kitcher and Brown admire.

Science is very different. Of course, it contains considerable technical expertise but that alone is insufficient to account for its peculiar epistemic and moral authority. Unlike plumbers, for better and worse, scientists as a group do not know the limits of their skills. They are supposed to be open to, if not engage in, severe tests of their theories and methods, which means that on occasion they will place themselves, their clients and perhaps even all of society at substantial risk — and also fail in the process. Moreover, scientists with the same technical skills disagree profoundly over the bounds of their epistemic and moral authority, which helps to account for the vastly different socio-political contexts in which similarly trained scientists have comfortably operated. Indeed, no history of science would be complete without acknowledging the various ways in which scientists have reshaped the life-world to expand the applicability of their expertise. (Here one might trace the protean history of the use of cost-benefit analysis in court cases such as Daubert.) However solidarity and trust are to be institutionalised both within the scientific community and with the larger society, it is by no means clear what, if any, illumination market signalling can provide (cf. Mirowski 2004).

Brown’s most sustained treatment of the problems surrounding science’s epistemic and moral authority pertain to the compatibility of science and religion, most of which occurs in chapter six. Here he notices that scientific and religious authorities in the US often clash in epistemic matters subject to scarcity, such as classroom time and textbook space (e.g. evolution v. creation) and research funding (e.g. stem cell research). Following Max Weber’s sociology, Brown argues that these conflicts ultimately boil down to differences in how claims to authority are legitimatised. In the Weberian jargon, science’s ‘mode of legitimation’ is usually ‘legal-rational’, religion’s ‘traditional’, though in both cases also sometimes ‘charismatic’. In this context, Brown speaks approvingly of Stephen Jay Gould’s idea that science and religion constitute ‘non-overlapping magisteria’, again suggesting an implicit division of labour between the two fields that somehow has managed to elude its practitioners, who end up simply misfiring at each other.

It never crosses Brown’s mind that these conflicts in authority might reflect the common descent of science and religion, at least in the West. In other words, their differences may lie less in their ultimate aims than in how they are best to be achieved. After all, if biologists treated Darwin’s ‘tree of life’ simply as a taxonomic device, comparable to the periodic table of elements, there would be little dispute with creationists and intelligent design theorists. Similarly, if Christianity confined itself to pastoral matters and disavowed all the cognitive pretensions of natural theology, then even Richard Dawkins would be able to sleep soundly. But of course neither side really stays within such boundaries, since both have claimed the origin and meaning of life as part of their epistemic jurisdiction. To be sure, it does not follow that scientists and theologians must clash on every single question relating to these big issues. It does not even follow that a subset of the most prominent theories on either side is likely to be shown to be true in the long term.

There is much room for negotiation by the two sides — but only as long as invidious distinctions between, say, ‘how’ (aka scientific) and ‘why’ (aka religious) questions are not part of the epistemic ground rules. For example, an historically reasonable interpretation for why scientists seem overwhelmingly to reject supernatural explanations is that they have domesticated the supernatural in terms of various ‘realist’ research programmes, which especially in the case of physics still countenance counterintuitive forms of causation — descendants of the ‘action-at-a-distance’ explanatory framework — that would make the average theologian blush. However, as long as the ontological weirdness of, say, string theory, parallel universes or quantum entanglement is constrained by mathematics and experiments - as opposed to Biblical exegesis and church services - no one questions whether students should be exposed to such ideas in the classroom, though their cost-effectiveness as research investments may be called into question (Smolin 2006).

In this respect, Brown fails to see the exact relevance of Weber’s social theory of legitimation to the science-religion dispute. What makes science more ‘legal-rational’ than religion is not its guiding ideas or metaphysical commitments but its modus operandi. Richard Dawkins may be one of the few professional scientists who claims outright that science has falsified most of the distinctive knowledge claims of religion, yet more circumspect writers like Gould and Brown also presume this to be the case, which explains their solicitous attitudes towards religious believers. However, against the backdrop of Western history, science may be best understood as religion pursued by technologically enhanced means (Noble 1997). Indeed, science in its most robust ‘convergent realist’ sense may make most sense as high-tech natural theology, in which case religion’s basic claims have been less falsified than sublimated. Thus, when Brown reports the results of rather simple-minded surveys in which scientists say that they do not believe in either a personal deity or a supernatural realm, their responses should be read as indicative only of the survey’s wording, which avoids a deeper and more relevant question: ‘Does science do a better job than religion at pursuing the cosmological issues traditionally of concern to religious believers?’ My guess is that a large proportion of scientists would strongly agree with this statement. If that is the case, then it will take much more than tact and diplomacy for science to maintain its epistemic and moral authority.


Brown, T. (2003). Making Truth: Metaphor in Science. Urbana-Champaign, University of Illinois Press.

Fuller, S. (2010). Science: The Art of Living. Montreal, McGill-Queens University Press.

Kitcher, P. (1993). The Advancement of Science. Oxford, Oxford University Press.

Mirowski, P. (2004). The Effortless Economy of Science? Durham, Duke University Press.

Noble, D. (1997). The Religion of Technology: The Spirit of Invention and the Divinity of Man. New York, Alfred Knopf.

Smolin, L. (2006). The Trouble with Physics. New York, Houghton-Mifflin.