Implicit Bias and Philosophy, Volume 2: Moral Responsibility, Structural Injustice, and Ethics

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Michael Brownstein and Jennifer Saul (eds.), Implicit Bias and Philosophy, Volume 2: Moral Responsibility, Structural Injustice, and Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2016, 285pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198766179.

Reviewed by Jeffrey A. Gauthier, University of Portland


While research on implicit attitudes has sparked great interest in psychology and the social sciences over the past two decades, interest in the potential impact of that research in the field of philosophy is more recent. This volume is the second edited by Brownstein and Saul on philosophy and implicit bias, the first concerning implicit bias and issues in metaphysics and epistemology. Both consist of papers from conferences associated with the Implicit Bias and Philosophy Research Project. Implicit bias is of particular interest for ethics and political philosophy for two reasons. In the first place, understanding the nature and effects of unconscious negative biases toward socially disempowered groups (most notably women and racial minorities), is important in coming to a grasp of the demands of social justice. Second, the unconscious and automatic nature of this kind of bias raises vexing questions when it comes to assigning moral responsibility for the actions it causes. Brownstein and Saul take up the second question in section one of the volume, and turn to broader issues of ethics and social justice in sections two and three.

The essays in section one (which make up just over half of the volume) address problems that implicit bias poses for individual moral responsibility, specifically whether and how one can be morally responsible for attitudes and behaviors following from implicit biases. Natalia Washington and Daniel Kelly lay out the problem in the initial essay, observing that implicit biases occasion distinct issues of knowledge and control. Ordinarily, we assume that an agent's being morally responsible for an action requires both knowledge of what she is doing and the ability to choose otherwise. Unlike explicitly held biases, however, implicit biases are "opaque to introspection," such that even an agent who explicitly disavows racist or sexist biases is subject to their influence. Moreover, implicit biases operate automatically, influencing attitudes or behaviors without the conscious control of the agent, and resisting attempts to change them directly (19). Given these features, it would appear that agents acting in the basis of implicit bias escape culpability for their actions. Despite this initial indication, all of the authors in section one conclude that moral agents can bear some species of moral responsibility for actions following from implicit bias, even as they differ as to the precise nature of this responsibility and/or why we have it.

For Washington and Kelly, historical changes in epistemic conditions can alter the conditions for moral responsibility, including responsibility for attitudes and behaviors following from implicit bias. They argue, for example, that a well-meaning egalitarian, who benightedly acted in a discriminatory fashion because of implicit bias in 1980, would bear less responsibility for that action than a well-meaning egalitarian who acted in the same discriminatory manner in 2014. This is because a well-meaning egalitarian in 2014 has considerably more resources to become aware of and compensate for the bias than the egalitarian of 1980. Accordingly she has more responsibility and is more blameworthy than the earlier egalitarian (21). Washington and Kelly dub their approach to responsibility externalist, in that it is social knowledge "outside the head" of the agent that determine the extent of the agent's responsibility (26-27).

Joshua Glasgow's essay also concerns the place of implicit bias in causing egalitarians to live up to their goals, but he frames his analysis around the issue of whether one is freed from moral responsibility when one is alienated from objectionable attitudes or behaviors. Generally sympathetic with "real self" theorists who argue that identification with an action is a necessary condition for full moral responsibility,[1] Glasgow observes that this occasions a puzzle with regard to guilt about sexism or racism brought about by implicit biases that an agent consciously and explicitly rejects: "When we truly and wholeheartedly disavow such attitudes, why should we feel guilty when we find ourselves with them, any more than we should feel guilty about our explicitly sexist uncle, whose sexism we also wholeheartedly disavow?" (38). In Frankfurt's famous example, we judge the willing addict who identifies with his desire for a drug more responsible than the unwilling addict who finds himself carried along by desires he fervently disavows. Drawing on recent discussions of variantism (the view that the conditions of moral agency are varied and contextual rather than invariant and universal),[2] Glasgow develops his view of Context-Sensitive Variantism in which the degree to which alienation from an action exculpates depends upon the kind and extent of the harm occasioned by the act. The reason that alienation exculpates more in the case of the unwilling addict, and less in that of racist or sexist agents acting on implicit bias, reflects the greater harm to relationships in the moral community occasioned by the latter actions.

Robin Zheng also makes use of distinct kinds of moral responsibility, drawing upon a distinction between attributability and accountability, where that latter may hold in the absence of the former. On her view, "What we need, in effect, are more ways of holding people accountable for their biases without attributing those biases to them" (75). Zheng's sense of accountability is akin to strict liability in the law, in which a person is held liable for act irrespective of whether mens rea exists. Zheng's argument for accountability is "two-pronged," based in part on the view that attitudes and behaviors influenced by implicit bias often do not deserve appraisal-based responses (because they are not directly conscious of the bias nor in immediate control of them), and also that such responses are pragmatically ineffective.

In their essay, Maureen Sie and Nicole van Voorst Vader-Bours also endorse diminished responsibility for action following from implicit bias, arguing for "indirect personal responsibility" for "stereotypical and/or prejudiced behavior that causes harm, even in cases where conscious control and awareness are absent" (90). Although the harmful behavior caused or influenced by stereotypes and prejudices may be outside an individual agent's awareness and control, Sie and van Voorst Vader-Bours argue that the agent still has a choice whether to act in ways that publicly endorse or discourage the stereotypes and prejudices. They sidestep the issue of whether agents are morally responsible for attitudes and behaviors influenced by unconscious bias, and focus instead on the "indirect" responsibility for negative stereotypes and prejudices occasioned by a failure to participate in collective action against them. Sie and van Voorst Vader-Bours conclude by arguing that this may include responsibility for scrutinizing and attempting to change or to compensate for one's own biases, especially for agents who hold social power over others such as employers, editors, or teachers.

Revisiting some themes in Glasgow's essay, Luc Faucher argues that research on implicit bias may justify revising some of our folk conceptions of moral responsibility. In the first place, the view that moral responsibility requires conscious intent, while justifiable in some non-oppressive moral contexts, seems objectionable in oppressive ones. Secondly, we may need to revise our ideas concerning how to decide whether an agent is morally responsible (or whether the "real self" is involved), if we take only first-person reports into account. As regards implicit bias, "If one is conscious of one's attitudes but does nothing to neutralize their influence, then one proves that one does not reject these attitudes wholeheartedly" (136). Finally, research on changing stereotyping and other behaviors that follow from implicit bias reveal that consciousness is not a necessary condition for control of bias, and may require a revision of our understanding of control as a condition for moral responsibility.

Section two consists of essays by Lawrence Blum and Anne Jacobson, both of which suggest that the recent focus on unconscious bias and stereotyping may divert attention from the problems of structural inequality that underpin the bias and stereotyping. Blum is pointedly critical of a particular research paradigm, Claude Steele's "stereotype threat." For Blum, the educational paradigm following from stereotype threat does not provide the right intellectual resources for students to recognize and combat negative stereotypes, and the way in which Steele "presents stereotyping primarily as a free-floating cognitive distortion" pays insufficient attention to the manner in which stereotyping is related to broader structures of inequality (161). Blum is particularly critical of stereotype threat researchers' failure to distinguish true from false generalizations in their experimental work on student populations, a distinction that Blum argues could alter some research results and also provide threatened minorities with a better intellectual buffer against false generalizations.

Jacobson probes the question of how much implicit bias really accounts for the persistence of racism and sexism in the United States, and calls attention to the way in which bias and structural factors intersect. In a classic case of implicit bias, she cites the example of a distinguished cardiac surgeon who expressed shock when it was revealed that only his white male patients had received angioplasty (181). Jacobson goes on, however, to observe that even if implicit bias were to be overcome, the wealth gap between African Americans and whites and the funding of medical care through private insurance corporations would still result in more whites receiving care. Moreover, echoing some of Blum's concerns, Jacobson argues that unfair biases can reflect institutionally constructed reality. For example, "The lack of support for women with children keeps them too often from working well at demanding jobs," confirming attitudes fed by implicit bias (184).

The final four essays, in section three, are less thematically unified and include various moral and legal reflections on implicit bias. Clea F. Rees considers how virtue ethicists might respond to the problem of implicit bias. Rees begins by observing that automatic cognitive processes such as implicit bias pose difficulties for virtue ethics in that these processes are not subject to direct deliberative control and because they influence attitudes and behaviors without the agent's being aware of it. She goes on, however, to cite additional research supporting the view that bias can be changed by developing "automatized egalitarian commitments." Rees argues that the demonstrated effectiveness of such commitments "not only supports a stronger defence of virtue ethics by showing that habituated egalitarian motivations can reliably guide cognitive processing without the need for ongoing deliberative control," but show that virtuous habits are more effective than approaches requiring conscious control (204).

Michael Brownstein argues for a "contextual approach" to implicit bias, one that borrows from what he identifies as three other ways of "thinking about the ethics of implicit bias." On the "ethics of internal harmony" view, the aim of identifying and learning to disengage from negative implicit biases is to achieve a state of internal harmony in the moral agent. This contrasts with the "world-first strategy" in which fighting implicit bias involves "changing social, institutional, and economic inequalities" (222). Finally, what Brownstein dubs the "seek/avoid" strategy recommends seeking out contexts likely to support desirable attitudes and actions, and avoiding those likely to activate negative implicit biases. Although Brownstein acknowledges the difficulties of the last approach (most notably that it is nearly impossible to predict when negative cues for bias will occur), his own contextual approach attempts a more sophisticated version of it.

In a broad-ranging essay, Samantha Brennan explores the relationship between implicit bias and micro-inequities. Indeed, her essay primarily concerns defining micro-inequities, identifying the harms that arise from them, and discussing possible institutional changes that might help to overcome them. Brennan argues, however, that micro-inequities and implicit bias are typically linked (244). She acknowledges that not all the inequities that follow from implicit bias are small (as the recent attention to instances of police "shooter bias" demonstrates), and some micro-inequities may reflect explicit biases. The fact that the harms that follow from intentional, explicit biases are rarely small and that we might "come to notice our implicit biases if they regularly brought about large differences in treatment" suggests that the two are related.

Katya Hosking and Roseanne Russell deal with the specific limitations of British employment equality law in offering legal remedies for discrimination arising from implicit bias. They emphasize that the longstanding assumption in the law that discrimination follows from the "free and conscious choices" places an undue burden of evidence on anyone claiming that differential treatment results from the unconscious mechanisms of implicit bias. Likewise the manner in which British law requires the claimant to prove that she has been treated less favorably than someone else in a similar situation and to provide evidence that bias was the cause of the differential treatment serves to depress reports of discrimination (260-61). As a remedy, Hosking and Russell first recommend replacing the requirement of less favorable treatment with that of unfavorable treatment alone. They also call for doing away with questions of the blameworthiness of employers, and focusing instead on the factual question of whether steps were or were not taken to address implicit bias.

The volume is an invaluable resource for understanding the link between moral philosophy and implicit bias -- especially as it concerns moral responsibility. A review cannot do justice to the painstaking attention that nearly all the authors devote to empirical research in this area. That said, the volume has a certain unevenness in its composition. The first five essays cite many of the same sources in developing generally tightly argued papers dealing specifically with the problem of moral responsibility for actions influenced by implicit bias, while the remaining six take up a variety of different issues. Moreover, the concern variously expressed by Blum, Jacobson, and Brennan -- that a focus on implicit bias and the problems it poses for individual moral agency serves to obscure deeper social and institutional structures that are at the root of the problem -- may well seem to be on display in the first section of the book.

As a number of the authors in section one argue, however, the problem of implicit bias can be understood to blur the line between individual moral agency and the forces in the world outside. Washington and Kelly conclude that at least degrees moral responsibility can vary based upon historical understandings external to the agent. Glasgow argues that moral responsibility is sensitive to varying contexts and depends upon harm rather than intention. Faucher likewise argues that responsibility may vary depending upon whether the context is oppressive. The appeals to externalism, variantism, and contextualism serve to challenge the bright line conventionally assumed to exist between questions of moral agency and political context. If these authors are right, understanding the power of implicit bias not only forces us to question our belief in the power of individual conscious intention and deliberate control over our actions, it can also make us more aware of the deep link between moral responsibility and the state of justice in the world.

[1] See for example Harry Frankfurt, "Freedom of the Will and the Concept of a Person," Journal of Philosophy 68 (1971): 5-20, and Gary Watson, "Free Agency," Journal of Philosophy 72 (1975): 205-20.

[2] See Joshua Knobe and John M. Doris, "Responsibility," in John M. Doris and the Moral Psychology Research Group, eds., (Oxford University Press, 2010): 321-54.