Impossible Worlds

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Francesco Berto and Mark Jago, Impossible Worlds, Oxford University Press, 2019, 324pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198812791.

Reviewed by Christopher S. Hill, Brown University


There is a long tradition of semantic theorizing that identifies the meanings of terms with reference and the meanings of sentences with truth conditions. Advocates of imperialist truth conditional semantics agree on this thesis and on the much stronger thesis that there is nothing to meaning over and above reference and truth conditions. They often differ, however, with respect to their views about what truth conditions come to. Some members of the imperialist school say that truth conditions are Russellian propositions or states of affairs -- that is, structured entities whose constituents are objects, properties, and logical operators. Others prefer to identify the truth conditions of sentences with classes of possible worlds, maintaining that the truth condition of a sentence S is the class of worlds in which S is true. The authors of the book under review, Francesco Berto and Mark Jago, are closely affiliated with the latter group of imperialists. They break with them in one important respect, however. They think that in order to do full justice to the complexities of meaning, it is not enough to invoke constructions based on possible worlds. An adequate theory must appeal to impossible worlds as well. They defend this view by philosophical arguments, implement it by proposing a metaphysical account of the nature of impossible worlds, deploy it in developing model theoretic treatments of modal logic and other formalisms, and then apply it to a range of philosophical topics that includes information, bounded rationality, fiction, and counterpossible conditionals.

Berto and Jago, while sole authors of most of the book, co-authored Chapter 11 with Christopher Badura, and Chapter 12 with Rohan French, Graham Priest, and David Ripley.

I will be quite critical of Berto and Jago, so should preface my remarks by emphasizing that their book is in its own way quite good. Indeed, it is just what you want if you are looking for a sophisticated and accurate introduction to the literature on impossible worlds, or you are interested in learning how the ideas in that literature can be extended in original and thought- provoking ways. My complaints are concerned only with the main thesis, the claim that the impossible worlds are required in order to explain a range of linguistic constructions and metaphysical facts. I will maintain that there are alternative explanations that employ superior explanatory equipment -- superior because independently motivated by theories and experiments in empirical science.

Semantics Based on Concepts and Fregean Propositions

Before considering the details of Berto and Jago's position, I will briefly review a quite different set of views that is rejected by truth-conditional imperialism. The alternative I have in mind is the Fregean tradition, according to which there are two dimensions of meaning, the realm of sense and the realm of reference and truth conditions. (Frege 1960) As it will be understood here, the realm of sense consists of entities that belong to two categories: a category of concepts and a category of Fregean propositions, where Fregan propositions are structures with logical forms that have concepts as their building blocks. Concepts are the meanings of words and phrases, and Fregean propositions serve as the meanings of sentences. As noted, this Fregean view also recognizes the existence of reference and truth conditions, and it is compatible with taking reference and truth conditions to be constructions based on possible worlds. It just insists that however truth conditions be understood, it is necessary for a semantic theory to acknowledge the existence of senses as well as truth conditions. As we will see, any such acknowledgment undermines most of Berto and Jago's arguments for impossible worlds.

It is, I believe, a widely held view that the Fregean senses of words can be profitably identified with concepts (whatever the merits of this view as an interpretation of Frege), but Berto and Jago do not recognize it as an option. Instead they regard senses as obscure, sui generis entities that are neither physical nor mental in character. (p. 190) Knowing this helps one to understand why they prefer an ontology of impossible worlds. But when senses are identified with concepts, the reasons for this skepticism lapse. To be sure, we are at present without answers to a number of important metaphysical and scientific questions about concepts; but despite these problems, it is clear that concepts play indispensable roles in well confirmed scientific theories and are therefore here to stay. To illustrate, they figure prominently in theories of categorization (see, e.g., Murphy 2002, Sloman 2005, Machery 2009), and theories of cognitive development (see, e.g., Keil 1989, Carey 2009, Carey 2015). The fact that they have such a firm empirical grounding is strong evidence that we will eventually be able to answer the open questions about their nature -- or will at least be able to settle the questions by making well motivated stipulations.

Hyperintensionality and Impossible Worlds

Berto and Jago construct a number of arguments for impossible worlds. Each of these arguments focuses on a particular domain -- the domain of meaning, the domain of knowledge and belief, the domain of information, the domain of the imagination, and so on. Further, each argument begins by asking whether facts in one of the domains can be adequately explained in terms of possible worlds. In every case the answer is "No, the facts in the domain exhibit hyperintensionality -- they are more finely individuated than any structures that are based purely on possible worlds." It is then maintained that the hyperintensional character of the domain can be fully accounted for if we add impossible worlds to our explanatory base.

In pursuing this strategy, Berto and Jago never consider whether hyperintensionality might also be accommodated by using an explanatory base of an altogether different kind -- specifically, a base consisting of concepts and propositions constructed from concepts. But as we will see, this would be a natural response to almost all of the forms of hyperintensionality they consider. Moreover, on ontological grounds, it would be a superior response, for as we noticed in the previous section, there are very strong independent grounds, having to do with experimental work in cognitive science, for recognizing concepts. As far as I know, there are no independent grounds for recognizing impossible worlds.

I will describe and reply to three of the authors' arguments. Two of my replies will be based on Fregean semantics. The other will invoke a hypothesis that has been brought into prominence by "dual systems" theories of cognition -- the hypothesis that we rely heavily on various quick but dirty heuristics in processing many kinds of information. (See, e.g., Kahneman 2011.) If I had the space to consider the authors' other arguments, I would urge that they too are undercut by a Fregean conception of propositions.

The first argument for impossible worlds has to do with meaning. It begins as follows:

If we take propositions, the meanings or contents of sentences, as sets of possible worlds, then necessarily equivalent propositions are one and the same proposition: possible worlds never disagree on necessarily equivalent sentences. Assuming again that mathematical and logical necessity are unrestricted, 'if Obama is human, then Obama is human' and '7 + 5 = 12' are true in the same possible worlds: all of them. So they express the same proposition, viz., the total set of worlds. This seems wrong: the sentences should have different meanings. (p. 22)

Everything said here seems quite true. It's clear that we have to find some entities other than classes of possible worlds to serve as meanings. Berto and Jago are also correct in saying that it is possible to solve this problem by taking propositions to include impossible worlds as well as possible worlds, for we can suppose that there are impossible worlds at which the sentence about Obama is true but at which the arithmetical sentence is false. They err only in not acknowledging that a Fregean solution to the problem, which consists in pointing out that the terms in the two sentences express different concepts, is superior.

Berto and Jago also offer an argument that is concerned with information. Suppose we take the information carried by a sentence to be the class of possible worlds at which the sentence is true. This proposal arguably has a number of virtues, but it also has the counter-intuitive consequences that all true mathematical sentences carry the same information, and that the information carried by any contingent sentence is shared with all of its equivalents, including equivalents that are so complex as to resist processing. The authors maintain that we can best avoid these consequences by allowing that information has to do with truth at impossible worlds as well as truth at possible worlds. This move allows us to preserve the intuitive connection between the notion of information and the notion of truth at a world.

In evaluating this argument, it is important to remember that we possess several different conceptions of information. Berto and Jago focus on the idea that the information carried by the sentence is the class of worlds in which the sentence is true, but it seems that we more often think of the information carried by a sentence in terms of what an individual can infer from an assertion of the sentence, given the individual's background knowledge, cognitive abilities, current levels of attention, access to pencil and paper, and so on. If we carefully distinguish between these two conceptions of information, we see that it is quite possible that that Berto and Jago's argument rests on a confusion. It is true that we do not want to say that all necessary truths carry the same information, or that all logically equivalent, contingent sentences are equally informative; but when we resist such claims, it is plausible that we do so because we have the second, deeply psychological conception of information in mind. To use the authors' vocabulary, the notions of inference and background knowledge are hyperintensional, and it is therefore not surprising that a conception of information that is based on those concepts is hyperintensional as well. Moreover, given the earlier points about the role of concepts in empirical psychology, it is pretty clear that the hyperintensionality of the psychological notions in question is best explained by saying that the objects of inference and knowledge are propositions that have concepts as their constituents.

I turn now to a different kind of argument. It begins by pointing to pairs of counterpossible conditionals like these:

(1) If Obama had had different parents, he would have had different DNA.

(2) If Obama had had different parents, he would have been a coat hanger.

Intuitively the first conditional is true and the second is false, but the standard Lewisian semantics for counterfactual conditionals implies that both are trivially true, since their shared antecedent is necessarily false. Berto and Jago maintain that we can best avoid this jarring result by changing Lewis's semantics in such a way that the truth conditions for counterfactuals depend on impossible worlds as well as possible worlds. According to the expanded Lewisian semantics that they favor (Lewis 2001), a counterfactual of the form (A □-> C) is true just in case some of the worlds in which both A and C are true are more similar to the actual world than any world in which A is true and C is false. Here the space of relevant worlds includes impossible worlds in addition to possible worlds. It is assumed there is a similarity ordering defined over this space.

The problem of how to handle counterfactuals with impossible antecedents has been with us for decades. For example, it figured prominently in Lewis 1973. This isn't the place for making and defending a detailed proposal about this difficult problem, but I would like to sketch an alternative to Berto and Jago's view that may at least suggest that an appeal to impossible worlds is unnecessary. In developing this argument, I won't be relying on concepts and Freegan propositions, but rather on the empirically well motivated "dual systems" hypothesis that the mind employs a number of quick and dirty heuristics in pursuing cognitive tasks.

I assume that we all have the intuition that (1) is true and (2) is false. I also assume that the common antecedent of these conditionals is necessarily false. And finally, I assume that we use quick and somewhat dirty heuristics in evaluating counterfactuals.

As various authors have pointed out (see, e.g., Kment 2014), it is plausible that one of the principal uses of counterfactual reasoning is to identify causal and explanatory relationships. Accordingly, it is also plausible that one of our heuristics for evaluating counterfactuals focuses on relationships of causal and explanatory relevance between their antecedents and consequents. Assuming this is true, we can appeal to the heuristic in explaining why we see (1) as true and (2) as false. We have these intuitions because we believe that there is a causal law linking parentage to DNA, and doubt that there is such a law connecting parentage to the property of being a coat hanger. The point here is that it may be possible to account for intuitions about the truth values of certain countermetaphysical conditionals without making any adjustments in standard Lewisian semantics. It may suffice to consider the heuristics that underlie the intuitions.

So far so good, but this leaves us with the question of how to deal with countermathematical conditionals like (3) and (4):

(3) If there were finitely many primes, then we could form a product P1 X P2 X . . . X Pn of all of the primes and add 1 to it, thereby obtaining a finite number P.

(4) If there were finitely many primes, then Obama would have been a coat hanger.

(3) strikes us as true, but it seems likely that many people would regard (4) as false. It is tempting to try to explain to explain these intuitions in terms of complex truth conditions involving impossible worlds. Before we do so, however, we ought to ask whether there is a fairly straightforward explanation of them in terms of heuristics. And in fact, it seems possible to explain the intuitions by supposing that there is a heuristic for evaluating counterfactuals with abstract subject matter that involves considering whether we can easily see deducibility relationships between the Fregean propositions in the antecedents and the Fregean propositions in the consequents. This would explain the intuitions about (3) and (4) because the deducibility relationship between the antecedent and the consequent of (3) is more or less transparent, while this is less true in the case of (4).

This hypothesis about the heuristic that underlies assessments of (3) and (4) has the advantage of explaining why different people often have different intuitions about countermathematical conditionals. (3) is in effect the first line of Euclid's reductio proof that there are infinitely many primes. A person who isn't familiar with Euclid's proof will probably be able to appreciate quickly that the consequent of (3) is deducible from the antecedent, together with certain obvious background principles; but until the person has seen the penultimate line of Euclid's full proof, which is an explicit contradiction, and has noticed the relevance of that line to the fact that any proposition is deducible from a contradiction, he or she may not be able to appreciate that there is a deducibility relationship between the antecedent and consequent of (4). Accordingly, the "transparent deducibility hypothesis" explains why many people are inclined to see (4) as false. On the other hand, a logician who is familiar with Euclid's proof will probably have a quite different assessment. ("Well of course it's true -- everything follows from a contradiction!")

Of course, at this point in time it would be inappropriate to claim more for the foregoing hypotheses about heuristics than that they have the status of somewhat plausible conjectures. But even so, they suggest that we should be quite careful in inferring conclusions about impossible worlds from data involving intuitions about the truth values of countermetaphysicals and countermathematicals.

Ersatz Worlds

Let us say that possible worlds are concrete if they are constructed out of concrete entities like human bodies, rocks, plants, and artifacts, together with properties of such entities. Possible worlds are ersatz if they are constructed out of entities of different kinds, such as Fregean propositions or interpreted sentences. For reasons that are not entirely clear to me, many philosophers have shown a strong preference for viewing possible worlds as ersatz rather than concrete. Thus, for example, there is a tradition of maintaining that possible worlds are certain maximally consistent classes of interpreted sentences. Berto and Jago place themselves firmly within this tradition. They go beyond it, however, in maintaining that impossible worlds are also classes of interpreted sentences, the difference being just that impossible worlds are not governed by a consistency requirement.

If one is convinced that there are impossible worlds, the motivation for supposing that worlds are classes of interpreted sentences becomes clear. It is far more natural to think that there are contradictory descriptions of objects than that there are objects with contradictory properties. Thus, we already know that there are contradictory descriptions and sentences. But there is no independent motivation for believing in contradictory objects. Indeed, there is intuitive motivation for disallowing them, even if they are thought to be buried somewhere in the farthest corners of modal space. Moreover, this reason for taking impossible worlds to be ersatz quickly gives rise to a reason for viewing possible worlds as ersatz as well. Simplicity and other considerations make it desirable to view possible worlds as entities of the same kind as their impossible brethren.

It is clear, however, that we really need to suppose that possible worlds are concrete. This is because we need to invoke actual and possible states of affairs in explaining the representational contents of veridical and hallucinatory perceptual experiences, and because states of affairs are most straightforwardly understood when they are taken to be classes of concrete possible worlds. When Macbeth seems to see a dagger before him, the content of his perceptual experience is a state of affairs of the form there being a dagger with certain physical properties at such and such egocentric distance and such and such angle of view. It is infinitely more natural to take this state of affairs to be a class of concrete worlds than a class of classes of interpreted sentences. The visual system can of course represent linguistic entities in a limited range of contexts -- we can see inscriptions of sentences. But it is absurd to suppose that the visual system represents linguistic entities in all contexts. How could evolution possibly have arranged for that?

To summarize: If impossible worlds exist, they should be taken to be ersatz worlds; if impossible worlds are ersatz worlds, then we really should suppose that possible worlds are ersatz worlds as well; but there is a decisive reason for thinking of possible worlds as concrete. So there are no impossible worlds.

It is sometimes maintained that figures like the Penrose triangle and the Escher waterfall show that the visual system can represent impossibilities. I cannot do justice to this suggestion here, but I would like to point out that there is an alternative interpretation of our experience of such figures. This interpretation has two parts: first, the claim that we only appreciate the fact that the figures represent impossibilities at a conceptual level; and second, the claim that we form this impression only gradually, by serially experiencing the different parts of the figures. According to the second claim, as far as purely visual experience goes, we never represent an impossibility, only the possible parts of an impossibility. The same applies to the visual imagination. (For discussion see Goodman 2010.)


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